2007.06.15

Robert J. Stainton

Words and Thoughts: Subsentences, Ellipsis, and the Philosophy of Language

Robert J. Stainton, Words and Thoughts: Subsentences, Ellipsis, and the Philosophy of Language, Oxford University Press, 2006, 272pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199250383.

Reviewed by Edouard Machery, University of Pittsburgh


Consider the following dialogue between two bird watchers in Texas:

Peter (pointing): A flame-colored tanager!

John turns his head.

Peter: Flying west.

For about 15 years, Robert Stainton has argued that, as the sentences above suggest, subsentential expressions can be used to make speech acts -- particularly, to make full-blown assertions. For instance, it would appear that Peter utters "Flying west" in order to assert that the flame-colored tanager is flying west -- and, according to Stainton, appearances are not illusory. Words and Thoughts: Subsentences, Ellipsis, and the Philosophy of Language is Stainton's book-length attempt to make a case for this view and to spell out its philosophical implications. Readers familiar with Stainton's work won't be surprised by the content of the book, since it draws on his numerous past articles on the topic.

Before presenting and discussing Stainton's main claims and arguments in more detail, I note that the title of the book -- viz. "Words and Thoughts" -- does not reflect its content. As indicated by the subtitle, the book is firmly rooted in the philosophy of language and in linguistics, and focuses on a rather specialized issue within these disciplines: how to understand speech acts that consist only of subsentential expressions. However, the title misleadingly suggests an extended discussion of the relation between language and thought -- an issue in the philosophy of mind and psychology that is only briefly considered at the end of the book.

Be it as it may, Stainton's take-home message is, to repeat, that, as appearances do suggest, subsentential expressions are regularly used to make speech acts, particularly assertions. Chapters 1 and 2 spell out this take-home message. According to Stainton, linguistic expressions that do not count as sentences either from a syntactic point of view (they are not headed by INFL) or from a semantic point of view (their content is not a proposition) can be used to make speech acts endowed with genuine illocutionary force. By contrast to, for example, "The flame-colored tanager is flying west," "Flying west," as uttered by Peter, is not a sentence from a syntactic point of view. By contrast to one-word sentences, such as "Attention!," "Flying west" is not a sentence from a semantic point of view, because its content is not a proposition. Still, by uttering "Flying west," Peter asserts the proposition that the flame-colored tanager is flying west (or some similar proposition) and John understands Peter as making this assertion. Note that, for Stainton, Peter does not merely convey this proposition, but literally asserts it. Indeed, Stainton argues that it is possible to distinguish the propositions that are asserted from those that are merely conveyed (e.g., implicated) by subsentential expressions used in speech acts. Suppose a liberal utters (1) while watching G.W. Bush on TV:

(1) Elected by Karl Rove.

She might intend to convey the proposition that Karl Rove's tricks have allowed G.W. Bush to be elected, although she literally asserts something quite different -- viz. that Karl Rove himself elected G.W. Bush.

One might wonder whether anyone would deny that subsentential expressions such as Peter's "Flying west" or our liberal's "Elected by Karl Rove" can be used to make speech acts. But many philosophers of language and some linguists have in fact done so. Maybe because he has been involved in the debate at hand for a long time, Stainton fails to be surprised by such denials and, unfortunately, does not consider the philosophical insights that might have driven these philosophers and linguists to argue that, appearances notwithstanding, subsentential expressions are not genuinely used to make speech acts. I will come back to this topic below.

A large part of the book (Chapters 3 to 7) is dedicated to rebut attempts to show that whenever subsentential expressions appear to be used to make a speech act, appearances are illusory. Chapter 3 considers the claim that when a subsentential expression appears to be so used, no real speech act, in particular no assertion, is in fact made -- a claim made by Stanley (2000) about some (but not all) speech acts consisting of subsentential expressions. (Maybe propositions are merely conveyed, not asserted -- as happens when people gesture to convey a proposition.) Chapters 4 to 6 consider positions that grant that assertions are made but contend (in different ways) that when a subsentential expression appears to be used to make a speech act, a sentence is really used. Particularly, Chapter 6 considers the claim that in such cases an elliptic sentence is used, as happens when one says, for instance, the second clause of (2):

(2) The first car turned left and the second one right.

Chapter 6 is the most interesting chapter of the book. By contrast to several other chapters, Stainton does not address merely possible replies to his views -- positions in logical space that have not been occupied -- but rather actual accounts of the use of (apparently) subsentential expressions in speech acts. Moreover, in this chapter Stainton appeals extensively and effectively to linguistic (mostly syntactic) data -- the kind of data linguists would use -- to provide strong support for his position. This use of linguistic data also illustrates nicely how beneficial a genuine acquaintance with linguistics is for the contemporary philosophy of language.

In the last three chapters of Words and Thoughts (9-11), Stainton brings his views about subsentential expressions in speech acts to bear on several important debates in the philosophy of mind and in the philosophy of language -- including the following bones of contention in contemporary philosophy:

·      Language and thought. Stainton argues that his views about subsentential expressions are inconsistent with a very strong position about the relation between language and thought -- viz. the position that to judge that p is to assert a sentence whose content is p in inner speech.

·      Logical form. Stainton argues that his views entail that sentences are not the only 'things' that bear a logical form.

·      Frege's context principle. Stainton discusses how his views fit with various readings of and arguments for the principle that "only in a proposition have the words really a meaning" (Frege 1884, 71).

·      The semantics-pragmatics boundary. Stainton concludes from his views about subsentential expressions that the content of assertions is not fully determined by semantic rules. Rather, determining what proposition is asserted when a subsentential expression is used to make a speech act is a pragmatic process.

Stainton makes a very strong case that subsentential expressions can genuinely be used to make speech acts. As noted above, the strongest alternatives contend that what appear to be subsentential expressions are in fact ellipses of complete sentences. Merchant (2004) and Ludlow (2005) are cases in point. Particularly, Ludlow (2005) points to the use of passive subsentential expressions in speech acts. For instance, a liberal might point to G.W. Bush and utter (1) above. Now, syntacticians typically assume that passives (as well as other syntactic constructions attested in (apparently) subsentential expressions used to make speech acts) are constructed via the transformation of sentence-level syntactic trees. Thus, the use of passive subsentential expressions in speech acts (e.g., 1) is evidence that the (apparently) subsentential expressions used in speech acts result from the derivation of sentence-level syntactic trees, consistent with the idea that these expressions are mere ellipses of complete sentences.

Stainton's main line of reply is to distinguish two issues: (A) how a subsentential expression in a speech act is derived, and (B) whether the subsentential expression itself is an ellipsis of a complete sentence. He concedes that the data highlighted by Ludlow are evidence that during the derivation of the (apparently) subsentential expressions in speech acts, sentence-level syntactic trees are produced. But he notes that this concession has no bearing whatsoever on what is really at stake -- whether the (relevant) expressions uttered in speech acts are genuinely subsentential or whether they are ellipses of sentences.

It is unclear whether Ludlow should be moved by this reply. (The linguistic data provided by Stainton make a more convincing case against the view that subsentential expressions in speech acts are mere ellipses.) Suppose that Stainton is right to distinguish (A), how a subsentential expression in a speech act is derived, and (B), whether the subsentential expression itself is an ellipsis of a complete sentence. Still, findings about the derivation of a subsentential expression (issue A) constitute evidence about its correct syntactic characterization (issue B). For example, evidence that a sentence-level tree is produced when (1) is uttered constitutes evidence that (1) is an elliptic sentence. For, one might ask why a sentence-level would be produced if (1) were not an elliptic sentence. Thus, Stainton cannot so easily deny the relevance of data about the generation of (apparently) subsentential expressions for the nature of these expressions (ellipses or true subsentential expressions). No doubt much more could be said about this problem, but, for the sake of space, I'll leave it at that.

I want to turn now to a topic already alluded to above. Why did philosophers and linguists deny that, appearances notwithstanding, subsentential expressions can be used to make speech acts? A possible rationale for this denial is the thought that sentences are central to speech acts. That is, were it not for the existence of sentences, natural language speakers would not make any speech acts -- particularly, they would not assert. To put the same point differently, a system of signs without sentences would not allow speakers to make speech acts, including assertions. (Of course, such a system of signs might allow them to convey propositions.) Importantly, endorsing the centrality of sentences in speech acts does not commit philosophers or linguists to deny, as many have in fact done, that subsentential expressions can also be used to make speech acts. It merely commits them to contend that subsentential expressions can be used to make speech acts because sentences are so used (and not vice-versa). It might be that philosophers have been led to the view -- convincingly criticized by Stainton -- that only sentences can be used in speech acts by their endorsement of the centrality of sentences to speech acts.

Defending the idea that sentences are central to speech acts (even though other expressions can derivatively be used in speech acts) is clearly beyond the scope of this review. I am bringing up this idea in this review because I find it unfortunate that, while rightly criticizing the denial that subsentential expressions can be used to make speech acts, Stainton missed the occasion to engage with this idea.

Stainton is a meticulous philosopher. In Words and Thoughts, he explains his positions and those of his opponents in great detail and with great care. He anticipates numerous objections and considers various logical positions -- including some that few reasonable philosophers would endorse. Although Stainton regularly appeals to the theoretical notions and theories developed by linguists, and although he typically spends little time spelling out the linguistic jargon he is using, the book is overall easy to read. (A few pages here and there -- for instance, the discussion of Chomsky's Minimalist Program -- could have been put more clearly, though.) Moreover, in addition to its main topic, Words and Thoughts also contains numerous interesting developments about side-issues, such as, e.g., the notions of sentence, ellipsis, and force, and the vagueness of the propositions that might be the content of assertions. Words and Thoughts is to be enthusiastically recommended to philosophers of language, particularly to the growing group of philosophers conversant with the cutting-edge work in linguistics.

Acknowledgment

I would like to thank Paul Égré for his comments on a draft of this review.

References

Frege, G. (1884/1978). Foundations of Arithmetic. Oxford: Basil Blackwell.

Ludlow, P. (2005). A note on alleged cases of non-sentential assertion. In R. Elugardo and R. Stainton (eds.), Ellipsis and Non Sentential Speech (pp. 95-108). Dordrecht: Springer.

Merchant, J. (2004). Fragments and ellipsis. Linguistics and Philosophy, 27, 661-738.

Stanley, J. (2000). Context and logical form. Linguistics and Philosophy, 23, 391-434.