2007.07.02

Rahel Jaeggi

Entfremdung: Zur Aktualität eines sozialphilosophischen Problems

Rahel Jaeggi, Entfremdung: Zur Aktualität eines sozialphilosophischen Problems, Campus, 2005, 267pp., €24.90 (pbk), ISBN 3593378868.

Reviewed by Frederick Neuhouser, Barnard College, Columbia University


Rahel Jaeggi's Entfremdung is one of the most exciting books to have appeared on the German philosophical scene in the last decade.  It has two significant strengths that are rarely joined in a single book: it presents a rigorous and enlightening analysis of an important but recently neglected philosophical concept (alienation), and in doing so it illuminates, far better than any purely historical study could do, fundamental ideas of one of the most obscure figures in the history of philosophy (G. W. F. Hegel).  That the latter is one of the book's chief achievements may not be apparent to many of its readers, for Hegel is rarely mentioned by name, and the book does not present itself as a study of his thought.  Nevertheless, the philosophical resources that Jaeggi brings to bear on the problem of alienation are thoroughly Hegelian in inspiration.  Jaeggi's book not only rejuvenates a lagging discourse on the topic of alienation; it also shows how an account of subjectivity elaborated two centuries ago can be employed in the service of new philosophical insights.

The main aim of Entfremdung is to resurrect the concept of alienation for contemporary philosophy.  Renewed attention to this concept is called for, according to the book's central premise, because without it philosophers are deprived of an important resource for social critique.  For the concept of justice -- the main focus of liberal social philosophers -- is insufficient to comprehend an array of social pathologies that are widespread in contemporary life and best understood as various forms of estrangement from self: meaninglessness, indifference to the world, the inability to identify with one's own desires and actions, bifurcation of the self.  The reason a resurrection is necessary is that traditional conceptions of alienation generally depend on substantive, essentialist pictures of human nature -- accounts of "the human essence" -- that are no longer compelling.  Marx's, for example, relies on a version of the Aristotelian notion of ergon -- an account of the distinctive species powers of human beings -- while Rousseau's (as elaborated in the Discourse on Inequality) relies on the assumption of certain "truly human" ends -- freedom, happiness, and the full development of human faculties -- that nature supposedly sets for the human species.  Jaeggi's ambitious project aims not only at reconstructing the concept of alienation such that it is freed from its essentialist underpinnings but also at showing how such a reconstructed concept brings to light and clarifies ethically significant phenomena that liberal social theories are powerless to detect.  This dual task corresponds to the two quite different levels at which the book operates so marvelously: the abstract analysis of an obscure but indispensable philosophical concept, and the phenomenologically rich consideration of various forms of what, under Jaeggi's analysis, reveals itself as alienation.

In Part I Jaeggi introduces readers to the object of her study by sketching a brief history of theories of alienation that includes concise but illuminating discussions of Rousseau, Hegel, Marx, Kierkegaard, and Heidegger.  The philosophical upshot of this survey is an initial, abstract formulation of what Jaeggi takes to constitute the core of alienation: "a relation of relationlessness" (eine Beziehung der Beziehungslosigkeit), a condition marked not by the absence of a relation to self and world but by a deficient relation -- a lack of proper connection -- to the same.  More precisely, alienation is said to consist in a distorted relation to oneself and to one's world that can be characterized as the failure adequately to appropriate oneself or the world, to make oneself or the world "one's own" (sich zu Eigen zu machen).  Alienation, then, stems from a disruption in one or more of the various processes of appropriation (of oneself or one's world), the successful carrying out of which is the mark of a "healthy," integrated, self-affirming subjectivity.  The possible consequences of such failure, depending on the particular way in which the process of appropriation is interrupted, include a sense of meaninglessness or estrangement, a loss of power in relation to self and world, and a subjugation to the products of one's own activity.  The ways in which these various effects of failing to make oneself or one's world "one's own" amount to constraints on one's will point towards the ethical significance of alienation, which for Jaeggi resides in the connection between alienation and freedom: "I can become a self-determining actor only in a world that I can make 'my own' in the sense of (appropriative) identification with it.  So understood, the concept of alienation thematizes the conditions of being able to understand oneself as a subject, as the master of one's own actions" (41); or, even more explicitly: "overcoming alienation is a presupposition of realizing freedom" (20).

It is the centrality of appropriation to Jaeggi's conception of alienation that accounts for its essentially Hegelian character.  For both philosophers the mark of human subjectivity is, abstractly formulated, an activity or process in which consciousness confronts what initially presents itself as given or "other" and then endeavors in some way to "make it its own" -- to strip its object of its foreign, merely given character.  Moreover, it is in such interactions with its "other" that the subject constitutes both itself and its world as something determinate.  Successful appropriation of this sort not only gives specific content to subject and object (and, so, "realizes" them); it is also the subject's characteristic aim, or aspiration, and hence the source of a fundamental "satisfaction," the absence of which manifests itself as estrangement, or alienation.  For both Hegel and Jaeggi, then, self and world emerge out of a single activity, an activity in which the subject integrates what is first foreign or "other" to it and, in doing so, transforms itself and world.

Despite this fundamental agreement regarding the nature of subjectivity -- or, as it is called here, "the distinctive structure of human existence" (65) -- Jaeggi's view diverges from Hegel's (or at least from common interpretations of his view) in two important respects.  First, Jaeggi attempts to avoid all suggestion that the subject's activity of appropriation is in essence re-appropriation.  For her, what initially confronts the subject as a foreign reality genuinely is foreign in that it is not the product of a prior subjective act that has merely remained unrecognized as such: "the given conditions to which one is supposed to be able to relate in an unalienated manner … are … neither 'invented' nor 'made'" (56).  This implies that overcoming alienation will consist not in recovering an original subject-object relation that has become obscured or forgotten -- even less in recovering some primordial differenceless harmony between the two -- but in taking possession of the world in a way that first establishes a mutually constituting relation between self and world.  (Here Jaeggi shows herself to be closer to Kierkegaard's appropriation of Hegel than to Marx's.)  Jaeggi's second major divergence from Hegel can be understood as a consequence of the first: if what the unalienated subject is ultimately to take itself to be is not already determined (or constrained) by the results of a prior but still un-self-conscious act of self-expression, then a theory of unalienated selfhood will focus not on the content or results of the subject's appropriative activity but on its process or form: the presence or absence of alienation depends not on what the self takes itself (or strives) to be but on how it determines what it is (or ought to be) (55).

This largely formal analysis becomes significantly more concrete in Part II, where Jaeggi discusses in admirable detail four examples of alienation -- of "living one's own life as an alien life" (16) -- each of which illustrates a different way in which the self's appropriation of, or identification with, itself and world is disturbed or incomplete: an academic who experiences a loss of control over the course and dynamic of his life; a young professional who fails to identify with the social roles he occupies; a feminist who, because her desires and impulses conflict with her self-conception, cannot recognize them as her own; and, finally, the protagonist of Pascal Mercier's Perlmann's Silence, who suffers an enduring and paralyzing indifference to himself and his world.  Jaeggi's phenomenological approach in Part II -- which takes up approximately half of the book's 260 pages -- is noteworthy for several reasons.  Most obviously, in its imaginative and nuanced depictions of specific cases of alienation it ascribes a much greater philosophical importance to concrete examples and narratives than moral philosophers typically do.  Instead of constructing highly artificial cases that generate counterexamples or help to fine-tune an exceedingly abstract moral principle -- think of the ubiquitous trolley car dilemmas -- Jaeggi relies on compelling flesh-and-blood examples derived from real experience that serve both to bring into view the complex and often diffuse phenomenon of alienation and to refine our conceptual grasp of it.  The cases she describes give tangible content, for example, to the otherwise obscure idea of a self-relation that the preliminary and abstract definition of alienation proposed in Part I leaves unexplained: an alienated "relation to self," her examples show, can manifest itself in a variety of familiar ways: as an alienated relation to one's actions or desires or projects or beliefs (68).

Yet Jaeggi's examples serve a deeper purpose as well: they are the true starting point of her philosophical project in the strictest sense of the term.  In contrast to the largely historical work of Part I, Jaeggi's phenomenological discussion plays a crucial role in establishing the validity -- or at least the plausibility -- of the normative vision of subjectivity that her historical predecessors implicitly or explicitly presuppose.  It is in Part II, in other words, that the real philosophical structure of the book's project comes into view: it begins with a consideration of examples of true-to-life phenomena whose pathological nature can be grasped only with the help of conceptual resources provided by the idea of self-estrangement.  Then, once the specific pathologies of the various examples have been identified and diagnosed, Jaeggi proceeds from the "negative" phenomenon (alienation) to reconstruct the "positive" vision of successfully realized subjectivity that implicitly underlies the diagnosis of those examples as instances of subjectivity gone awry.  In taking this step Jaeggi arrives at her own answer to a question that, at least since Fichte, has been a dominating concern of German philosophy: how are we to conceive of the essential nature (or "structure") of human subjectivity?  The method Jaeggi employs to answer this question can be summed up by the question, What must subjectivity be like -- what structure must it manifest -- if alienation in its various guises is a possible and not infrequent feature of human existence?  In attempting to uncover what the possibility of alienation reveals about the nature of subjectivity in general, Jaeggi adopts the same method -- the via negativis -- that Kierkegaard famously employs in his treatment of despair (as well as the method that has been fruitfully explored by one of Jaeggi's teachers, Michael Theunissen, whose influence on this book, in my view, runs much deeper than its explicit references to him suggest.)

In Part III Jaeggi returns to more abstract philosophical terrain, where she employs the conceptual resources won from her phenomenological analyses to refine her account of alienation, to fill out and defend her "appropriation model" of the self, and to situate the phenomenon of alienation in relation to more familiar objects of ethical reflection, such as freedom, self-realization and agency.  Here, too, Jaeggi shows herself to be a skillful and imaginative philosopher who is thoroughly at home in both the Continental and Anglo-American traditions.  Indeed, one of the book's features that will make it especially interesting to readers outside Germany is that Jaeggi throughout draws on and responds to the work of many contemporary English-speaking philosophers whose work is relevant to her concerns, among them Frankfurt, Nagel, MacIntyre, Williams, and Taylor.

There is only one noteworthy respect in which Jaeggi's book fails to deliver what it implicitly promises.  The book's subtitle -- "A Contemporary Problem of Social Philosophy" -- leads one to expect a work that investigates the social causes and manifestations of alienation rather than what one in fact finds: a philosophical account of a, broadly speaking, ethical phenomenon, together with an underlying "theory of the self" (or theory of human subjectivity).  At the beginning of her book Jaeggi suggests a connection between her project and critical social theory: once the phenomenon of alienation has been adequately clarified, a path is opened for criticizing institutions insofar as they fail to furnish the social conditions individuals need to live a life free of alienation (15).  Yet this thought, however intriguing, remains undeveloped.  Indeed, the central role played by subjectivity in Jaeggi's account might be taken to suggest that the most important causes of alienation are internal rather than external and that psychology, not social theory, is the place to look for the solutions to self-estrangement.  Readers will also note that Jaeggi pays little attention to that well-known strand of alienation-based social critique -- made famous by Marx -- that locates alienation not primarily in a form of subjectivity but in objective features of social practices (e.g., labor in a capitalist society) that remain a source of alienation regardless of the subjective condition of those who sustain them.  It would be foolish, however, to criticize Jaeggi for not having said more about either of these social-theoretical projects, each of which would require a book-length treatment of its own.  The project she has carried out instead is important and masterfully executed, and it is sure to reinvigorate philosophical discussion of alienation in all of its forms.  Entfremdung is an astonishingly good representative of the work of an impressive new generation of German philosophers who, with roots in both of its major traditions, seem well positioned to reanimate Western philosophy, as well as to mend the internal cleavage that has for too long been its fate.