M.C. Dillon

Beyond Romance

Dillon, M.C., Beyond Romance, State University of New York Press, 2001, 188pp, $11.95 (pbk), ISBN 0791450988.

Reviewed by Patrick Burke, Seattle University

Beyond Romance is an attempt at a new phenomenology of love. More specifically, Dillon wants to analyze and argue for the phenomenon of sexlove as the authentic form of love. To make this argument, Dillon will call into question the poetic construct of romantic love that he claims is responsible for the erotic malaise of our time. Dillon sees romantic love everywhere, from internet cyberlove and Freudian motherlove to the Christian demonization of sex and the moral restriction of sexuality by natural law theory to the norms of biological teleology. Dillon intimates that within this romantic love there is a polarization between the transcendental ideality of perfection coveted by Plato and Hegel and the troubling reality of sexual embodiment as depicted in works of literature from D.H. Lawrence to the Marquis de Sade. The argument for the phenomenon of sexlove will require the taking of a middle path within and beyond this polarization. Dillon articulates this middle path along the conceptual and methodological axes of Merleau-Ponty’s ontology of the flesh in which the binary logic of Western metaphysics (self and other, mind and body, spirit and matter, etc.) is overcome. Central to Merleau-Ponty’s ontology is the phenomenon of the reversibility of flesh as manifest in the intertwining of the sensing with the sensed in carnal knowledge. Accompanying Dillon’s use of Merleau-Ponty there is an unmistakable subtext that deserves noting, namely Dillon’s ressentiment relative to postmodernism. He discloses a covert retrieval of romantic love by Derrida and the postmodernists as consequent upon the sophistry and vacuity of their semiological reductionism where interpersonal meanings, rather than being directly given in our corporeal engagement with other body-selves, are reduced to idealities constructed of signifiers.

Dillon’s argument comes to a critical point in the penultimate chapter of the book, “The Flesh of Love.” Here Dillon consolidates the results of his previous eight chapters wherein he criticized the classical treatment of romantic love from Plato to postmodernism, with special emphasis on contributions by Hegel, Freud, Sartre, and Derrida. The insight guiding his several critiques of romantic love and the development of the arguments of this chapter is the privileging of carnal knowledge as the measure of sexlove. Dillon introduces this idea of carnal knowledge through the argument that one cannot love a person one does not know, that love for that person is directly proportionate to knowledge of that person, and that such knowledge is not by means of intelligence and spiritual affectivity independent of bodily sensing and feeling, but by the mutual overlapping and intertwining of these modes. For Hegel as for Plato, the dialectical knowing of the other is not grounded in our bodies and the world we inhabit. For Sartre, dialectical knowing seeks to capture, degrade, and possess the other as an object and is rooted in the ontological dualism of body and spirit. For Derrida, knowing the other is a function of an ideality conditioned upon iterability. Each of these forms of romantic love does not seek to know the other as he or she really is in his or her flesh and blood finitude and otherness, but as an idealized projection beyond the givens of corporeal intentionality. For Dillon, to desire without knowing is to impoverish both desire and the desired, and to know without desiring is to impoverish both knowing and the known.

A case can be made that Dillon’s argument has been encountered before. Already in ancient Hebrew texts, “yadah” means to know through sexual intercourse. And in recent times John Dixon anticipates Dillon’s insight when he argues that we know with the same flesh that desires and we desire with the same flesh that knows [John W. Dixon, Jr., “The Erotics of Knowing,” Anglican Theological Review, Vol. LVI, No. 1, Jan. 1974]. However, Dillon’s recontextualization of the tradition of desiring and knowing within Merleau-Ponty’s ontology of the flesh brings about some provocative new turns.

One of these new turns is adumbrated in the Phenomenology of Perception, where Merleau-Ponty claims that we can understand better how things or beings exist in general if we see how a thing or a being begins to exist for us through desire or love. Dillon seizes upon this epistemic privileging of desire and love. First of all, he presents with remarkable clarity Merleau-Ponty’s argument for the primordial sociality of the flesh. Rather than being founded on reflective recognition through the concept, interpersonal communion is both grounded in and is the ground for the reversibility between perceivers of the seeing and the seen, of the touching and the touch. The caress as a mode of carnal knowledge is not merely unidirectional and objectifying. Through the reversibility of the caress I sense in the depth of the beloved’s flesh his or her sensing just as she or he senses my sensing, a co-sensing which is by no means inferential but radically direct. Dillon thematizes this under the ancient Greek word “mimesis”. The claim here is that, prior to any reflective appropriation of my identity, there is an originary transfer of corporeal schemas between perceivers, an originary corporeal ‘impregnation,’ if you will, of one in and by the other; for Dillon, this is what is meant by ‘mimesis.’ Perception is thus already and always intercorporeal, intersubjective, is always and already desire for the other’s desire. This is what Freud failed to realize in his reduction of the mother to a sex object. For Merleau-Ponty, it is the attitudes and desire directly expressed in and as the face and gestures of the mother, in her looking, touching, and speaking, which constitute the first phenomenal field for the infant. For Dillon, the mother as this enveloping primordial field was never originally an individual for the infant, and when she finally becomes so, the infant’s desire is configured differently than it would be if she were a desired mate. Following Merleau-Ponty, Dillon is quick to note that mimesis does not entail fusion with the other. Mimesis is the driving force of eros, and eros seeks intimacy with the other as other. In the intimate life the other is loved as he or she who always and already transcends me. The intimate life is thus characterized by the paradox of nearness through distance. This paradox is one of the partial truths of romantic love that Dillon wishes nonetheless to appropriate. In what it describes as the loss of self through ecstatic sexual union, romantic love seeks, however, to resolve this paradox through a pure fusion, a pure coincidence with the adored other. For Dillon such a search is essentially poetic, nostalgic, futile, and illusory, given that romantic love itself rightly posits the original ideality and unity of the lovers as a secret that is lost forever in corporeal separation and finitude. In wishing and loving the otherness of the other, sexlove seeks not identity through fusion, but unity with the other through differentiation, which opens the possibility for continuing wonder, discovery, and mutual growth.

The phenomenology of sexlove is further developed by Dillon’s recuperation of the ancient Greek notion of ‘nobility,’ a fundamentally interpersonal notion that entails the intersection of aesthetic attractiveness or beauty with moral goodness or virtue. Nobility is the value that excites eros. Here Dillon advances the sometimes controversial thesis that one can love only the beautiful and the good, that we cannot love an ugly person and that an ugly person cannot love. Arguing for the radical reversibility and intertwining of matter and spirit, of the visible and the invisible as constitutive dimensions of flesh, Dillon claims that there can be no inner nobility of character that does not express itself in outer gestural style and behavior, that spiritual and physical beauty are inseparable. The ugly person is so distortedly self-absorbed that he or she cannot love; the ugly person is he or she whose gestures are not informed by nobility of character, is he or she who circumscribes sexlove relations within power relations. In sexlove the desired body is not a sexual object to be used for my power, pleasure or prestige, but is another person who returns my glances and caresses, and who desires my desire of his or her nobility as he or she also desires my own.

While readers may wish to affirm, in fact embrace and celebrate, Dillon’s masterful extension of Merleau-Ponty’s thought into the domain of sexlove as a critique of romantic love in all of its historical variations from Plato to Derrida, they may have some problems with the consistency of his analysis and criticism, in his third and fourth chapters, of sexual ethics based upon natural moral law theory. First of all, Dillon decries the very project of a sexual ethics in favor of moral principles applicable to any domain of human behavior. Yet he includes the norms of endurance, fidelity, and commitment, of intensity, ecstasy, and selflessness, of volition and vulnerability in his ‘measure’ of sexlove; in the same breath, however, he abhors the development of ethical criteria relative to specific sexual acts. The reader may fail to find consistency here. Second, opting for a principles only approach, he affirms a heteronomy in which specific rules are seen as inevitably time-bound and culturally relative. Denying that there are absolutes, he purports nonetheless to avoid any abject relativism. Dillon argues that categorical imperatives must yield to hypothetical imperatives. In natural moral law theory, however, some sexual acts are considered, by their very nature, intrinsically wrong. There doesn’t appear to be any place in Dillon’s analysis for this possibility, and yet in his preface to Beyond Romance he claims that molestation and rape are ‘bad things,’ regardless of motives or circumstances. In natural moral law theory, moral rules are action-specific, prohibiting, permitting, or prescribing specific behaviors and, in the case of the moral condemnation of rape or molestation, these rules are not merely helpful guidelines or rules of thumb; they bind the conscience categorically, i.e., unconditionally. And like the natural moral law ethicist, Dillon doesn’t seem to allow any exceptions to moral rules absolutely prohibiting rape or molestation. It is reasonable to suspect that Dillon would admit, therefore, that moral rules take their justification from the higher moral principle of which they are the expression relative to concrete acts. But in that case, rules that condemn unconditionally are rooted in imperatives that are not hypothetical, as Dillon argues, but categorical, such as that which commands us to treat all persons as ends and never as means only. Again, the reader may fail to find consistency here. To his credit, Dillon does affirm the moral meaning of the body. The reversibility model that guides his analysis from beginning to end establishes, beyond the binary logic of Western rationality, the body as incarnate spirit or inspirited matter. I am my body; I am this sensing and sensed flesh. To elevate biological laws of reproduction, for instance, to the status of exclusionary moral laws is to ignore the full personhood of the body that includes the natural freedom of self-determination. Thus Dillon is right to free sexlove from the reproductive dyad, to separate love making from baby making. Dillon is quick to point out, however, that to treat the biological dimension of our personhood as so much raw material for the creative and experimental uses of freedom is to court disasters such as disease and untimely death.

Beyond Romance is intended for a readership wider than the circle of academics. As is true of so many books written today, the various chapters of Beyond Romance were presented as independent essays at various philosophical conferences. What this means concretely in the case of this book is that the themes and analyses of these chapters overlap and are repeated, although, to Dillon’s credit, always with a difference. Such overlapping and repetition is one of the virtues of this book, making it eminently readable for critical thinkers whose interest in various facets of culture take them beyond the confines of ordinary philosophical discourse. Its analysis of the relation between carnal knowledge and the good life achieves universal appeal.