2007.08.09

Jacques Derrida

Geneses, Genealogies, Genres, and Genius: The Secrets of the Archive

Jacques Derrida, Geneses, Genealogies, Genres, and Genius: The Secrets of the Archive, Beverly Bie Brahic (trans.), Columbia University Press, 2006, 96pp., $25.50 (hbk), ISBN 0231139780.

Reviewed by Krzysztof Ziarek, University at Buffalo


Jacques Derrida's Geneses, Genealogies, Genres, and Genius: The Secrets of the Archive is one of his last published texts (Éditions Galilée, 2003), a lecture delivered at the inauguration of the Cixous Archive at the Bibliothèque Nationale de France (BNF).  As such, it is in part an homage to Hélène Cixous, whom Derrida salutes as one of the most important contemporary French writers, still very much underappreciated in her own country, and in part a broader reflection on the notion of genius and on the idea of literature.  Derrida ascribes the lack of appreciation for Cixous's writing in France to the specific way in which Cixous's writing pressures and revises -- often through homophonic, syllabic, and syntactic play -- the linguistic, literary, and institutional conventions of the French language: "What Hélène Cixous's work does to these codes is a storm so unpredictable and so intolerable that there is no question of her garnering a following." (54)  Against this backdrop, Derrida proceeds to demonstrate the literary and philosophical import of Cixous's texts, anchoring his analysis in a series of language plays, largely homophonic, which he traces through several of Cixous's prose writings.  These are among the best and most interesting moments of Derrida's own text, as they tend to be rooted in a close reading of Cixous's language and a celebratory appreciation of the "genius" of her writings.  Perhaps the most salient of these is the homophonic play between several words beginning with the sound "g" (for instance, in the title of the conference at which Derrida presented the paper: "Geneses, Genealogies, Genres") and the French word jet, which Derrida links on the one hand to the Latin root of key philosophemes like subject, object, or project, and on the other to the sense of throwness, describing the manner of being-in-the-world in Heidegger's thought. (49-51)  Without having time to develop these implications in any significant detail, Derrida suggests rich and far reaching implications that the inventiveness of Cixous's language opens up for the parameters of philosophical reflection on being.

Since the Cixous materials archived at the BNF contain her letters, notes, and, above all, for Derrida at least, her dream journals and notes on the relation of dreaming to writing, Derrida frames his observations on Cixous's writing in terms of the pivotal tension and frequent translation between dreaming and waking/writing.  He notes "Cixous's indefatigable and unique translation of the infinite world, of all possible worlds of the nocturnal dream, into the incomparable vigilance of one of the most calculating of diurnal writings." (23)  This translation from dreaming into waking, and thus of dreams into fiction, is what motivates Cixous's prose: "Her writing is set in motion by waking but also, thanks to the energy of waking, she works on waking, she burns the energy of a waking which is the order of the dream as well, at the order of the dream but not of the order of the dream, at the order of the dream which also orders, actively and passively, its own interruption." (41)  Dream is what "orders" (calls on) Cixous to write and what therefore orders (structures) her texts. At the same time writing performs a rupture of and away from dreaming, constituting an irruption and a translation into another order: namely that of the written language and literary conventions.  This sense of the rupture of dream as a translation from dreaming into literary language becomes the marker of what Derrida sees as the "secret" at the core of literature, which he describes through a phrase borrowed from Cixous's prose: "Tout-puissance-autre", the "Omnipotence-other" of literature.  Readers familiar with Derrida's earlier writings will find several key tropes of Derrida's thought inscribed into this figure of the omnipotentialitity of literature: the absolute other, the force of law and the law of genre, the unavowable gift, unconditional hospitality, undecidability (of fiction and reality).  What is new, and introduced by Derrida to deliberately upset the sense of connection, continuity, classification, and descent implied by the title of the conference, "Geneses, Genealogies, Genres," is the problematic of genius, deliberately given in the singular in Derrida's title.

To underscore the rupture which the singularity of genius introduces into the genealogical, genetic, and generic filiations, Derrida (re)defines genius in terms of a giving that does not know itself, of an overflowing, unmasterable gift: "Genius is a gift that never appears such, like what it gives." (71)  "Genius gives without knowing it, beyond knowledge, beyond the awareness of what it gives and of the fact, of the performative event that constitutes the gift, if there is one." (75)  This sense of unknowability reflects the "generic" indecidability of the false and true genius, the impossibility of proving its existence or absence.  As Derrida remarks, the truth of genius has no place for proof (87).  In the shortest "definition" Derrida offers, "genius is what happens" (78).  It is "the experience of the eventfulness of the event," or of the "it might have been" (c'eût pu) (86).  This quality of genius is marked in Derrida's text by the indecidable play of the French word tu: both the adjective "silent" and pronoun "you."  Genius is thus the overflowing address of the you and to the you, and an address which is "structurally" silent: it silences itself by the specific way in which it gives itself.  This is the "secret" of literature, its potency to break open its own articulations, to say more or otherwise that what it says, and, while "saying," to keep the range and amplitude of this potency silent and unknowable, in short, secret, in what happens to be said.

Celebrating the occasion of archiving Cixous's work at the BNF, Derrida's text shows the necessity and the impossibility of archiving literature, or, at least of its "genius": while the archive preserves and contains the literary and non-literary texts, it cannot contain the omnipotentiality of literature, which ruptures the bounds of the archive.  Storing the texts, one keeps open, and thus in play, the "Omnipotence-other" of literature: the archive keeps secret and thus secretly working, the force of the literary language.  This force gives the impetus to read, to learn how to read and interpret, at the same time that it ruptures the power and the authority to read in a decisive manner, to "master" the text.  "It delivers us over to the experience of the wholly-other as might {puissance} of the wholly-other or Omnipotence-other." (48)  The unmasterable force of literature thus ruptures, through the "powerless power" of fiction, as Martin McQuillan points out in his "Foreword," the power of literary and cultural institutions, as well as political power and sovereignty.

The problematic of the unmasterable force of literature is obviously not new in Derrida but it receives here an interesting and beautiful articulation through Cixous's notion of the "Tout-puissance-autre" of literary writing.  It also brings into the orbit of this interruptive, "secret" force of literature the notion of genius, redefining "geniusness," as Derrida puts it, in terms of the unpredictable experience of the event, and thus as the interruption of the title chain of the conference, "geneses, genealogies, and genres."  Genius happens by rupturing and excusing itself from the genealogical, genetic and generical ways of thinking about literature and language.

Given the limitations of the occasion for which Derrida prepared this text, one could not expect much more from it, though I would have welcomed a more sustained reflection on the kind of power/potency which Derrida locates in literature.  Derrida himself links it, via Cixous, and Levinas, it seems, with the power of the "absolutely other": literature as "the absolute place of the secret of this heteronomy, of the secret as experience of the law that comes from the other," the law of unconditional hospitality. (48)   As McQuillan aptly formulates it, though putting aside the theistic traces in Derrida's text, "This power is not a counter-force to the sovereign but the activity of the passive 'what happens' of the all-powerful, powerless other." (x)  Indecidably active and passive, powerful and powerless, this force of literature evokes another discourse, the one Heidegger started developing in and after the 1936-38 Contributions to Philosophy, precisely the discourse of das Macht-lose, that is, of the power-less as power-free (as I suggest elsewhere).  It is not only the play of "g," ge- and jet that ties Cixous's work to the Heideggerian problematic of throwness but, above all, the idea of the "powerless power" of literature, which is marked, and perhaps re-marked and revised, by another trace -- a secret one? -- of das Macht-lose, the power-free, of the event.  This possible connection can only be mentioned here, for to develop it -- and in addition there is a great deal of rich interplay between Cixous's language and Heidegger's reflections on saying, silence, the unsaid, and mystery in relation to language -- one would need a long and careful study.  The way in which Derrida, or, as he generously points out, already Cixous herself, inflects this problematic of the force of literature is the critical feminine momentum of the rupture: of the traditionally masculine idiom of genius, as well as of the conventional patriarchal forms and the operating power of the literary and cultural institutions.  This problematic would clearly merit a more sustained reflection on the sexual and gender dynamic of this neither active nor passive, neither powerless nor powerful, force of literature.  Derrida's short and engrossing text is a "forceful" invitation to such further, albeit unmasterable, reading.