Brian Leiter

Reply to Leiter

Reply to Leiter (NDPR 2002.10.08)

Reviewed by David Hoekema, Calvin College

Professor Leiter’s reply corroborates, in substance and tone, the incidental comments that I made in my review about the Philosophical Gourmet Report and its principal author. The Guide’s preference for analytic approaches to philosophy—which, as Leiter rightly observes, are today applied fruitfully to the study of Continental figures—does not entail, nor did I suggest, that philosophers and deans ought to disregard its comments and rankings. Indeed, its value would be greatly enhanced if it had serious competitors. Would that there were three or four wide-ranging guides to graduate study in philosophy in circulation, each exhibiting certain biases and idiosyncrasies (terms that, in my dictionary but apparently not in Leiter’s, connote skepticism without amounting to slander). Faute de mieux, the Gourmet Report has probably exercised greater influence over the decisions of prospective graduate students, deans, and accrediting agencies than is healthy in a now vigorously pluralistic discipline.

For the record, since Leiter came to a contrary conclusion, I do not endorse Bruce Wilshire’s claim that analytic philosophers are Cartesian phenomenalists, nor do I agree with him that analytic philosophy inevitably severs head from heart. At best, the Anglo-American analytic approach and the post-Hegelian school of Continental reflection seem to me to challenge and enrich each other, employing distinct modes of discourse to address overlapping sets of problems and concerns. Here at Calvin, for example, in a department once almost wholly analytic in orientation but now more broadly representative of the discipline, our majors do some of their best work by bringing Kierkegaard into dialogue with Plantinga on the nature of religious belief, Merleau-Ponty with Wittgenstein on issues of perception and language, Freud with Searle on the nature of the self. The inclusion in recent APA programs of papers employing a broad variety of philosophical approaches, which for Leiter marks philosophy’s decline, seems to me a sign of vitality and health.

I have never attended a SPEP meeting, but I am aware that scholars outside philosophy appear regularly on its programs, as they do at the gatherings of aestheticians and philosophers of science. Leiter’s further claim that SPEP members are concentrated in “less than 20 departments” strikes me as dubious, but perhaps it is true. (I assume that he means “graduate departments” and is referring not just to their current faculty members but also to their graduates.) But to infer from these two facts that SPEP harbors a host of “mediocre academics … [hiding] behind the fig leaf of ‘Continental philosophy’” is to invoke two hidden premises: (1) that philosophers are wiser than their colleagues in other disciplines and (2) that philosophers employed or trained at the other 50 or 60 doctoral programs are wiser than those associated with the suspect 20. It would be comforting—as a philosopher and a Princeton Ph.D.—to believe that these premises were true, but it would require a certain blindness to the evidence at hand.