2007.08.17

Alasdair MacIntyre

The Tasks of Philosophy: Selected Essays, Volume 1; Ethics and Politics: Selected Essays, Volume 2

Alasdair MacIntyre, The Tasks of Philosophy: Selected Essays, Volume 1, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 230pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521854377; Ethics and Politics: Selected Essays, Volume 2, 239pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521854385.

Reviewed by Charles Larmore, Brown University


These two volumes of essays are devoted to the twin concerns that have long animated Alasdair MacIntyre's work.  One theme has been the historical character of all moral thought.  In A Short History of Ethics (1967) he argued that philosophy cannot hope to rise above the vicissitudes of history by turning to "meta-ethics" and focusing on the timeless meaning of "right" and "good", since what they mean reflects the substantive ethical outlooks in which they figure and so is bound to change over time.  It was in the same historical spirit that he developed in After Virtue (1981) his well-known critique of modernity.  The irresolvable conflicts we face between respecting rights and promoting the general good, between individual happiness and allegiance to community, are in reality symptoms of an underlying disarray.  The intellectual resources at our disposal are but fragments of an overall, essentially Aristotelian vision of the human good that has lost the authority it once enjoyed.  The essays in Volume 2 of the present collection (Ethics and Politics), largely written in the 1990s, pursue this critique in some new directions.  The most interesting chapters have to do with the differences between Aristotle and some of his Renaissance and modern followers, the nature of the prohibition against lying, and the contemporary fascination with moral dilemmas.

A second theme that runs through MacIntyre's work is less widely appreciated.  It is his concern with the nature of philosophy in general -- its aims and procedures, its fundamental concepts such as "truth" and "reason", its relation to its own history and to society at large.  The essays in Volume 1 (The Tasks of Philosophy) take up these issues, usually with a close eye on the implications for ethics, but ranging widely over other areas of philosophy as well.  They reach farther back than those in the second volume, some of them to the 1970s and thus to a period before MacIntyre had become, in the aftermath of After Virtue, the "Thomistic Aristotelian" he now terms himself and who wrote all the essays in Volume 2.  One of the older pieces -- "Epistemological Crises, Dramatic Narrative, and the Philosophy of Science" (1977) -- offers some valuable insight into the nature of that philosophical conversion.  It explains why his turn to Aristotle and Aquinas has taken the form of an appeal to the idea of "tradition" that has no real parallel in their own thought.  It may be indeed one of the most important essays he ever wrote, "a major turning point in my thinking" as he observes in the volume's Preface (I, vii).

In this essay, MacIntyre sets about drawing some broad epistemological lessons from the writings of Thomas Kuhn and Imre Lakatos.  What they have taught us, he argues, is that the sciences do not set about solving problems on the basis of universally available canons of inductive inference and explanatory adequacy.  Any such purely formal canons are too weak to decide much of substance.  Instead, problems are identified and solved in accord with the more specific standards of some developing conception of how inquiry should proceed in the given domain, some "paradigm" or "research program" -- or as MacIntyre prefers to say, some "tradition".  When difficulties arise that cannot be met by existing means, standards have to be revised, and such a revision is successful and the crisis resolved (here he follows Lakatos more closely than Kuhn) when the new conception shows itself able, by its own lights, to do all that the previous one did, plus more:  while holding on to what is already known, it must better handle the newly troublesome phenomena as well as explain why the earlier view failed to do so.  Scientific progress is only intelligible in comparative and historical terms, as a kind of "dramatic narrative".  The reason to accept some theory is not that it accounts for the evidence absolutely speaking, but rather that it does so better than its rivals have done.

For MacIntyre, the consequences extend beyond the philosophy of science to the nature of systematic inquiry in general.  Contrary to the usual assumptions of rationalists and traditionalists alike, reason and tradition do not stand inherently opposed to one another.  "Reason operates only within traditions".  It has to rely on the standards of some specific and ongoing approach to a given subject matter, and since these standards can change as different theories are devised to handle new problems, no tradition in this sense simply passes down unaltered some supposedly age-old pieces of wisdom:  "a tradition is a conflict of interpretations of that tradition" (I, 11, 16).

These general conclusions had in turn a deep influence on MacIntyre's subsequent work in ethics.  Having long recognized the way moral self-understanding is always historically situated, he now had the means to prevent this recognition from slipping, as it can easily do, into skepticism or cultural relativism.  Our moral thinking counts as an exercise of reason, if it forms part of some substantive ethical tradition able to preserve its best insights while adapting to handle new problems as they arise and succeeding in this better than its rivals.  In MacIntyre's view, Aristotelian ethics is just such a tradition, superior in these regards to the modern currents of Kantianism and utilitarianism that have sought to supersede it.  Whether or not this assessment is fair, it bears pointing out that neither Aristotle nor Aquinas conceived of their ethical thinking as a "tradition" in this sense.  They lacked the historical sensibility and sense of contingency which that concept embodies and which are so much a part of our own modern consciousness.  I do not mean that MacIntyre cannot really be a "Thomist Aristotelian".  But he is one in the reflective way that only a modern thinker can be.

This 1977 essay illuminates therefore one important aspect of what MacIntyre means by his Thomist Aristotelianism.  Indeed, the great value of this collection as a whole is the new light it throws on the distinctive features of his own moral philosophy.  Another key aspect also comes out in Volume I, particularly in "First Principles, Final Ends, and Contemporary Philosophical Issues" (1990) and "Moral Relativism, Truth, and Justification" (1994).  According to MacIntyre, Aristotelian moral philosophy aims at acquiring the truth about its subject matter.  It therefore displays the basic characteristic of every kind of pursuit of knowledge, which is, as Aristotle said in the Metaphysics, that "truth is the telos of a theoretical inquiry" (I, 58).  Truth is the goal which our various practices of formulating, examining, and testing knowledge-claims are designed to achieve.  We always judge truth, of course, from the standpoint of the standards and beliefs we presently endorse.  Traditions of inquiry are historically situated.  But the goal is to discover the way things really are, independently of the process by which we develop our views about them.

This realistic conception of truth, he argues, constitutes the valid core of the familiar if disputed idea of truth as correspondence, the idea that Thomas formulated in De Veritate (I.1) as the "adaequatio rei et intellectus" (I, 200, 210; also II, 77).  It stands opposed to recent attempts (Robert Brandom and Crispin Wright are discussed) to equate truth with rational justification or warranted assertibility under ideal conditions.  Such accounts run together the nature of truth and our means of access to it, the goal and the activities aimed at the goal.  As a result, they render unintelligible the practice of justification itself.  For the ways we go about evaluating hypotheses (subjecting them, for instance, to severe rather than easy tests) draw their rationale from the end, getting it right about the world, to which they are presumed to move us closer.  So too, the circumstances under which we need to examine beliefs we already hold are determined by the goal that critical reflection of this sort is meant to achieve.  It is no sign of rationality to be constantly asking whether our beliefs are justified.  "It is when and only when the truth about some subject matter is at issue that there is point or purpose in advancing and evaluating them" (I, 58).

Moreover, proposals to explicate truth in terms of assertibility under "ideal" conditions appear condemned to failure.  If the "idealized" procedures of justification still bear some mark of the actual practices that are their model, then it remains possible to imagine that beliefs satisfying such procedures may fall short of capturing the way things really are.  The more the procedures are idealized, however, so as to foreclose that possibility, the less we can say anything about them except that they are "ideal" in virtue of allowing us to discern what it indeed true (I, 56f.).

All these arguments against non-realist conceptions of truth seem to me right on target.  The pursuit of knowledge only makes sense if truth, its goal, is understood as a correct description of the way things really are, as correspondence to reality -- though I would add that it is not truths as such (the more the better), but rather significant truths, able to serve as crucial tests or having explanatory power, that make up the object of systematic inquiry.  Nonetheless, there is a difficult question connected with this realist idea of truth that MacIntyre never properly addresses.  He intends, as I have said, that his general account of knowledge and truth apply to moral thought in particular.  "Among the truths to which we aspire truth about the human good is of peculiar importance" (I, 180).  Yet what is the nature of the reality to which ethical truths supposedly correspond?  How do the virtues, rights, and duties, the good and evil about which they talk, fit together with the reality that the empirical sciences describe?  What place is there for value in a world conceived through the eyes of modern science?

MacIntyre never poses himself this question.  As a result, he never considers a hybrid position that some philosophers of a realist spirit have advanced in order to avoid ontological perplexities.  Why not combine a realist conception of scientific knowledge with a non-realist account of moral judgments according to which "true" in their case just means being rationally justifiable to all whom they concern?  Perhaps MacIntyre would reply that such views must fall afoul of the impossibility of defining "ideal conditions of assertibility" in a way that is appropriately transcendent with respect to existing modes of justification but that does not end up explicating "ideal" in terms of "truth".  With such a rejoinder I heartily agree.  But then it is incumbent to explain how realist interpretations of both moral and scientific truth can fit together in a coherent picture of the world.  "Thomistic Aristotelianism" may have been able to handle this question readily enough in the age of Aquinas.  The situation looks very different on this side of the modern Scientific Revolution.

A third significant feature of the cause MacIntyre has espoused emerges in a striking essay of Volume II, "Moral Dilemmas" (1990).  Many philosophers have come to believe that a basic fact of the moral life to which any adequate ethical theory must do justice (but which few have really acknowledged) is that we can find ourselves faced with situations where we will end up doing wrong whatever alternative we choose.  MacIntyre disagrees.  Certain modern theories may lead to such dilemmas, but not his beloved Thomistic Aristotelianism.  Naturally he allows that even from its standpoint determining what is the best thing to do may prove exceedingly difficult.  But a moral dilemma in the strict and proper sense is a choice in which we cannot fail to do wrong no matter what we choose, and a theory which regards ethics as a province of reason -- as does his Thomism -- cannot allow this sort of result.  For if we must choose between doing X and doing Y, and if Y would produce a wrong so that we ought to do X, yet X would produce a wrong so that we ought to do Y, then it seems that we ought to both do X and not do X but Y instead (or both Y and not Y), which is a rational inconsistency.

One way to admit the existence of moral dilemmas and yet prevent this sort of inconsistency is to give up the "rule of agglomeration" which holds that if one ought to do A and one ought to do B, then one ought to do both A and B.  But that is not the path which MacIntyre follows, and for reasons he finds expounded in Aquinas' ethics.  First, apparent dilemmas only arise because of some wrong action the individual has previously done:  if I have promised to help someone carry out a burglary and must now decide between two wrongs, breaking a promise and participating in theft, the conflict in which I find myself has come about because of the wrongful promise I made (II, 92, 97).  And second, the dilemma even then is only apparent   For if one or the other of the moral requirements involved were more accurately understood, we would realize that they do not actually conflict:  it is wrong to suppose that promises are binding, whatever the circumstances and whatever the content of the promise (II, 98).  On both scores, therefore, we happen upon what appears to be a moral dilemma only because of some moral imperfection in ourselves, and not because moral demands can objectively conflict.  For MacIntyre, Thomist ethics is rationally superior to other theories by virtue of recognizing this truth.

That Aquinas held such a view seems to me right.  But it is not obvious that one can dispose of every sort of moral dilemma in this fashion.  What about "Sophie's choice", for instance?  It is not essentially through any fault of her own that she finds herself confronted with having to choose which of her two children she will save from slaughter by the Nazis.  Nor will it do to say that her duty is clear and that she should save one of them even if she cannot save both.  For choosing one means attributing greater value to that child's life than to the other's, which is contrary to all conscience, whereas choosing not to choose entails giving them both up to execution.  Whatever she does, she does a horrible wrong.

We ought not, moreover, to be surprised that true moral dilemmas can arise.  Morality tells us how things ought to be, yet however rational its demands, and however conscientious our efforts, there can be no guarantee that the way things are will always turn out to be hospitable enough to morality as to permit its demands to be satisfied.  Unless, that is, the world happens to be divinely ordered to that end.  Countless times in both these volumes, MacIntyre proclaims himself a "Thomistic Aristotelian", without ever indicating the point of the adjective.  What on his view did Aquinas add to Aristotle's ethics?  Perhaps precisely such an assumption.