2002.10.15

Jonathan Adler

Belief's Own Ethics

Adler, Jonathan, Belief's Own Ethics, MIT Press, 2002, 403pp, $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 0262011921

Reviewed by Earl Conee, University of Rochester


1. Exposition

A standard evidentialist view asserts that some epistemic evaluative status is determined by evidence. Jonathan Adler regards the standard sort of evaluative evidentialism as derivative. Adler’s evidentialism is primarily an . priori psychological thesis about believing with full awareness. One is “fully aware” of a belief when one attends to the fact that one has the belief and considers why one believes it. (p. 29) According to Adler’s evidentialism, it is impossible for one to be fully aware of a belief while one regards oneself as having inadequate epistemic reason to believe the proposition. (p. 32)

Adler contends that his evidentialism can be derived from the concept of belief. The derivation includes a reductio argument that is supposed to be available to anyone who is fully aware of believing P. Adler contends that such a person can infer a contradiction from a conjunction of the form: P, and I do not have sufficient evidence for P. Using for illustration the case where “P” expresses the proposition that the total number of stars is even, Adler spells out the inference as follows:

I believe that the number of stars is even. All that can secure for me the belief’s claim of truth is adequate evidence (reason) of its truth. I lack adequate evidence. So I am not in a position to judge that the number of stars is even. So I do not judge that it is true. So I do not believe that the number of stars is even. (p. 30)

Adler argues in a parallel way that one who is fully aware of believing oneself to have adequate epistemic reason to believe P can infer a contradiction from a conjunction of the form: I have adequate evidence for P and I do not believe P. (p. 31) From these two arguments Adler infers the following general psychological thesis:

(PE) Necessarily, if in full awareness one regards one’s evidence or reasons as adequate to the truth of P, then one believes that P; and if in full awareness one attends to one’s believing that P then one regards one’s evidence or reasons as adequate to the truth of P. (p. 32)

Adler derives a more traditional evaluative sort of evidentialist view from (PE) and his argument for it. The further reasoning goes essentially as follows. The necessity of (PE) is supposed to be a conceptual sort of necessity, because (PE) is supposed to be implied by the concept of belief. From this Adler infers that belief demands to be based on adequate evidence. From this Adler infers that believing is in accord with the concept of belief only if it is based on adequate reasons. And from this Adler infers the following evaluative evidentialist thesis:

(OE) One ought to believe P only if one has adequate reason for P. (p. 52)

So much by way of outlining the theoretical core of Belief’s Own Ethics and its defense in the work. The rest of the book is of considerable independent interest. In Chapter 2, Adler argues against the form of doxastic voluntarism that asserts us to have some direct control over our believing. In Chapter 3, Adler argues for intellectual liabilities in self-deception and intellectual assets in making one’s beliefs explicit. In Chapter 4, Adler faults various strategies for forming beliefs under conditions where, according to his evidentialism, those propositions could not be believed with full awareness. Chapter 5 is a very helpful defense of the view that we have support from background evidence for believing testimony when this believing is justified. In Chapter 6, Adler argues that tacitly confirmed background beliefs play the regress-averting role that foundationalists attribute to basic beliefs. Chapter 7 offers solutions to Moore’s paradox, the lottery paradox, and the paradox of the preface.

Chapter 8 largely formulates an argument to the effect that practical pressures on us to believe place us in a situation that refutes the evidentialist standard for what we ought to believe. Chapters 9 and 10 are principally devoted to responding to that argument. Chapter 9 appeals to a sort of contextualism to argue that adequate justifying reasons for belief can exist in cases where one would not have been able to meet some reasonable challenges to the belief. Chapter 10 argues that not all epistemic reasons to doubt a proposition are reasons that undermine the evidence one has for the proposition. There Adler distinguishes full belief from belief with full confidence. He contends that some epistemic reasons to doubt a proposition justify diminished confidence in the proposition without weakening evidence that justifies full belief.

Finally, Chapter 11 discusses ways in which reasonable methods of forming beliefs tend to be self-correcting.

2. Criticism

First let us consider the reductio argument, cited above, that is supposed to be available to one who believes with full awareness that the number of stars is even. The first step in the reasoning concerns “securing” a claim of truth that is made by believing. According to Adler, believing a proposition is holding the proposition to be true. (p. 6) So, by believing P, the believer makes a sort of claim of truth for P. Adler has the fully aware believer affirm that having adequate evidence for P is all that could “secure” for the believer the truth claimed by believing P. This security is unclear, but nothing finally turns on what it is.

Adler then has the believer draw an inference from this thought about security together with the assumption that she lacks adequate evidence that the number of stars is even. The inferred proposition is that the believer is not in a position to judge that the number of stars is even. “In a position to judge,” is also unclear, but nothing finally turns on its meaning either. Not being in a position to judge is supposed to follow from the lack of security, which in turn is supposed to follow from the lack of adequate evidence. Not being in a position to judge is supposed to imply not judging, and thus, not believing. Putting these things together, one’s lacking adequate evidence is supposed to imply a series of things, with the final implication that one does not believe.

There is no such implication. Many beliefs are held wittingly in the absence of adequate evidence. Prominent among these beliefs are exercises of faith. It is common to believe a religious proposition on faith with full awareness. Thus, lacking the security of adequate evidence for a proposition is compatible with believing the proposition.

The reductio contradiction is not otherwise forthcoming. This is not surprising. The reasoning is attributed to a fully aware believer, but the contents of the reasoning make use of only the believing. So, if the conclusion could be soundly inferred by a fully aware believer, then it would be soundly implied for all believers. We would have the astounding result that believing entails having adequate evidence.

Some of Adler’s evidentialist conclusions suggest that he had in mind reasoning that does rely on the assumption of full awareness. Again, the thinking that Adler actually ascribes to a fully aware believer is this:

I believe that the number of stars is even. All that can secure for me the belief’s claim of truth is adequate evidence (reason) of its truth. I lack adequate evidence. So I am not in a position to judge that the number of stars is even. So I do not judge that it is true. So I do not believe that the number of stars is even.

Nothing here involves reflecting on one’s reasons to believe, as full awareness requires. It may well be that Adler intended the reasoning to include fruits of such reflection. He may have intended something like this instead:

I believe that the number of stars is even. All that can secure for me the belief’s claim of truth is adequate evidence (reason) of its truth. I regard myself as lacking adequate evidence. If I regard myself as lacking adequate evidence, then I am not in a position to judge that the number of stars is even. So if I regard myself as lacking adequate evidence, then I do not judge that it is true. So if I regard myself as lacking adequate evidence, then I do not believe that the number of stars is even. So I do not believe that the number of stars is even.

The latter reasoning does not support the astounding result that believing entails having adequate evidence, which Adler does not otherwise endorse. The penultimate conclusion is strong enough to warrant the version of Adler’s evidentialism that is initially cited above: it is impossible to be fully aware of a belief while regarding oneself as having inadequate epistemic reason to believe the proposition. Thus, this reasoning may better represent the intended argument.

In any case, faith refutes this reasoning as well. The penultimate conclusion is not true. Again, it is common to believe, while recognizing an absence of adequate evidence, for instance, that all suffering is ultimately justified. (Believing that the number of stars is even – the case that is explicitly in question – is less commonly an article of faith. But there is no difference in principle. In fact, this proposition may be entailed by the fairly prevalent conviction: “It all evens out in the end”.)

Faith is not the only sort of exception here. People have various strongly held views that they regard as “matters of opinion”, on topics ranging from comparative athletic achievement to ethics and politics. This classification evinces a recognition that these are beliefs concerning which they lack enough evidence to know.

It may be that Adler would doubt that these sorts of examples are cases of full belief. But again, he takes believing a proposition to be holding it to be true. The faithful and the otherwise opinionated go at least that far. In any event, declining to count such attitudes as beliefs would obscure and diminish the topic.

Let us now consider the argument described above from (PE) to (OE). We assume (PE): necessarily, one believes P with full awareness just when one regards oneself as having adequate evidence for P. Let us also assume that (PE) is a consequence of the concept of belief. Adler infers from this that belief demands to be based on adequate evidence. There is a sense in which fully aware believing definitely demands taking oneself to have adequate evidence – it is a necessary accompaniment of fully aware believing. But that does not show that just plain believing demands anything about evidence. Compare: Fully aware believing definitely demands considering why one believes – the considering is stipulated to be part of full awareness. That is no reason to think that just plain believing demands considering why one believes.

There is no apparent sense in which even fully aware believing demands having adequate evidence. Adler argues for only the weaker thesis that fully aware believing entails regarding oneself as having adequate evidence, and we have questioned the success of that argument. Much less is there any apparent sense in which fully aware believing makes a demand for having adequate evidence that might carry over to just plain believing.

Setting this point aside, let us assume that believing demands having adequate evidence in a sense that implies Adler’s next step: believing is in accord with the concept of belief only when it is believing on adequate evidence. From this Adler infers (OE), the claim that one ought to believe only with adequate evidence. But (OE) does not follow. Not all demands ought to be met. One’s doxastic attitudes can make various moral, prudential and epistemic contributions. In determining the doxastic attitudes that one “ought” in any sense to have, these other factors can outweigh any value in acceding to the demands of belief. “Ought” expresses summary evaluations. What one “ought” in any given sense to believe is determined by all that decides what is best in that sense – morally best, or prudentially best, or epistemically best, or etc. For example, it may be imprudently depressing to believe in accordance with the demands of belief. Then it is not so that one prudentially ought to believe.

Even for the sake of the epistemic good of believing on adequate evidence, it is not always best to believe a proposition on adequate evidence. It is possible for pivotal instances of believing on inadequate evidence to result in more belief on adequate evidence in the long run. For instance, someone’s taking a “joy ride” of believing on faith may cause a cognitive “crash” that has an irreplaceably salutary effect on the person’s inclination to believe on adequate evidence. In general, any demand imposed by belief is at most part of the grounds on which our evaluative standards determine what one ought to believe.

3. Conclusion

Belief’s Own Ethics is a work of striking originality. Its distinctive evidentialist position is resourcefully defended. The valuable contributions in the rest of the work do not turn on its fundamental evidentialist theses.