2007.09.03

Sebastian Rödl

Self-Consciousness

Sebastian Rödl, Self-Consciousness, Harvard University Press, 2007, 207pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674024946.

Reviewed by Béatrice Longuenesse, New York University


Sebastian Rödl offers a theory of self-consciousness which he justifies on original systematic grounds, while also explicitly placing it in the philosophical tradition opened by Kant and German Idealism and culminating in Marx's Theses on Feuerbach.

Self-consciousness, as Rödl defines it, is the power to think of oneself as oneself.  This power is fundamentally related to the capacity to use the word "I."  A theory of self-consciousness is thus inseparable from a theory of self-reference:  investigating self-consciousness is investigating the way(s) in which "I" refers.  And this, in turn, is investigating the sense rather than just the meaning of "I": not what one refers to by "I" (that bit is easy, being provided by the simple rule: "I" refers to whoever thinks or says "I") but how "I" refers.

Answering the question: "how does a word refer?" is understanding what Frege called the "Art des Gegebenseins," the "mode of givenness" of the object referred to by the word.  Rödl calls this, after Evans, the "logical perspective" on the object and argues that clarifying the nature of the logical perspective on an object depends on clarifying the ways in which we know the object.  Is there, then, a specific way of knowing an object that grounds first person reference?  Rödl argues that there is.  It is what he calls "spontaneous knowledge" as opposed to "perceptual knowledge."  Spontaneous knowledge grounds first-person reference just as perceptual knowledge grounds demonstrative reference (which means, then, that first-person reference is most definitely not a species of demonstrative reference).

Spontaneous knowledge is knowledge one has of an object just by being it, whereas perceptual knowledge is knowledge of an object one has by observing it.  There are just two ways in which one can know an object just by being that object: knowing oneself to believe something just by knowing what to believe and knowing oneself to do something just by knowing what to do.  There is thus no theory of knowledge and no theory of action without a theory of self-consciousness and self-reference, and conversely no theory of self-consciousness and self-reference that is not a theory of knowledge and a theory of action.  These topics are one and the same topic, a unity that is, according to Rödl, largely ignored by contemporary epistemologists.

The plan of the book naturally falls out of these very strong theses.  Chapter 1 ("First-Person Thoughts") outlines the structure of Rödl's theory of self-consciousness and self-reference as I just outlined it.  Chapters 2 ("Action and the First Person") and 3 ("Belief and the First Person") explain the relation of first-person thought to spontaneous knowledge of oneself in action and belief, respectively.  Chapter 4 ("Reason, Freedom and True Materialism") argues that the theory of self-consciousness thus laid out is also a theory of reason, and moreover a materialist theory in the spirit of Marx's Theses on Feuerbach.  Chapter 5 ("Receptive Knowledge") contrasts spontaneous (first person) and receptive (third person, perceptual) knowledge and argues for a new, anti-empiricist epistemology.  And finally Chapter 6 ("The Second Person") argues that first person and second person reference are mutually determining and depend on one and the same order of reason.

In Chapter 2 ("Action and the First Person"), Rödl explains in what sense knowledge of action is first person knowledge, namely one of the two fundamental kinds of knowledge in which I know that an object is F by being that object.  This is what the use of "I" expresses: the relation of the knowing subject to the object of knowledge is one of identity.  Action thoughts are first person thoughts by virtue of the fact that I know that I am doing something not by observing an action, but by being the agent of whose action I have knowledge.

But what is this knowledge that rests not on observing, but on being that which is being known?  In the case of action, it is knowledge that something is being done by knowing what to do.  Now, knowing what to do is derived from practical reasoning.  Practical reasoning -- reasoning about what to do -- the conclusion of which is an action, is thus also knowledge of the action, i.e. knowledge of its cause.  To characterize knowledge of action Rödl coins a form of predication, "I*do A", which stands to first person reference as perceptual predication stands to demonstrative reference.  "I*do A" predicates of "I" an action which is the answer to the question what to do and which, precisely by virtue of being such an answer, is being done.  Doing, knowing what to do, having in view the practical reasoning that leads to knowing what to do and thereby doing it, are one and the same process.

One can see why Rödl claims for his view the merit of reaching beyond the simple rule for the meaning of "I" -- " 'I' refers to whoever thinks or says 'I'" -- to an explanation, or rather a formal characterization, of the ways of knowing by virtue of which a referent is presented for "I" in accordance with this rule.  Because of the coincidence between the practical reasoning that provides an answer to the question what to do on the one hand, and the knowledge of the cause of the action being performed on the other hand, the object being known -- the agent, of whom an action is predicated -- and the subject of knowledge -- the very same agent, determining for herself what to do -- are one and the same.  We also see why Rödl calls his theory a "materialist" theory of self-consciousness:  the first person standpoint he elucidates in the case of action is realized in what he describes as "a movement that is thought" (an action) and "a thought that is a movement" (practical reasoning).  Moreover, he offers a theory of practical reasoning according to which all ends of action, whether "finite" (stemming from particular desires) or "infinite" (providing the overarching principle of unity of the process that is an action) are unified by what he calls an "objective life form."

Rödl's account of belief parallels his account of action (Chapter 3: "Belief and the First Person").  Just like action (the conclusion of practical reasoning), belief (the conclusion of theoretical reasoning) offers a way of knowing such that if I know someone to be F (to endorse a belief), then I know that I am F (I endorse a belief).  And just as in the case of action, this feature is not primarily a psychological, but a formal feature:  it depends on the form of thought that grounds the belief.  Just as Rödl coined the form of predication "I* do" to characterize an action that is performed by virtue of being represented by practical reasoning as something to do, similarly he coins the form of predication "I° p" to characterize the nexus between subject and proposition, where the proposition that is the object of belief is represented as something to believe by virtue of being the conclusion of a piece of theoretical reasoning.

In Chapter 2, Rödl argued that practical reasoning depended on an overall ordering of desires and ends (finite and infinite).  That order, he argued, cannot be grounded on desires themselves, for they do not have the right kind of temporality: they are changing states and as such cannot ground the unity of a process of reasoning.  Similarly, he now argues, in Chapter 3, that sensations cannot ground the unity of a process of theoretical reasoning.  The order of practical reasoning was that of infinite ends unified by an objective practical life form.  The order of theoretical reasoning is that of infinite grounds -- grounds under which are subsumed, as instances, any number of beliefs connected to one another as (finite) ground to consequence -- unified by a power of knowledge.  Here Rödl acknowledges his debt to both Kant and Frege: elucidating the form of theoretical reasoning is elucidating the formal features of the inferential process the conclusion of which is a proposition to be believed, namely true.

In Chapter 4 ("Reason, Freedom, and True materialism"), Rödl derives from the parallel structure of action and belief, and the way they respectively underwrite first person reference, an explanation of the relation between reason, freedom, and self-consciousness.  The previous chapters have shown that both action and belief fall under a formal order, respectively that of an objective life-form and that of a power of receptive knowledge.  This formal order is moreover represented by the subject whose acts and beliefs fall under the order: this is what practical and theoretical reasoning respectively are.  In being represented, the order is also endorsed.  This is how reason, freedom and self-consciousness are one.  Rödl thus offers a new interpretation of Kant's characterization of freedom as autonomy, or acting under a formally represented order.  To say that a law is a law of autonomy is not, according to Rödl, to characterize it by its origin, as one does when one defines it as a law one has freely chosen.  Rather, it is to characterize it by its form.  An N acts according to a law of autonomy, if it acts according to a law that follows from its own nature.  This property of autonomy is shared by humans and other living beings.  But in addition, human beings are autonomous in another, stronger sense: they fall under laws that are their own in that they are represented in first person thoughts, as has been explained in Chapters 2 and 3.

From these explanations Rödl derives an unexpected and refreshingly unusual endorsement of Anscombe's view that "I" does not refer, while providing a more moderate version of it.  What Anscombe has in view, he says, is actually receptive reference, reference mediated by an act of receptivity, such as the kind of reference grounded in perceptual knowledge.  She is right to say that "I" does not refer in this way.  "I" expresses first person knowledge, knowledge not from affection by, but from identity with, its object.  Anscombe saw this point when she said that first person thoughts do not contain acts of reference distinct from predication.  Moreover, she also saw that first person thoughts, insofar as they represent movements and actions, represent material substances.  Anscombe, according to Rödl, is the first to have developed a view of first person thoughts in line with the materialist theory of self-consciousness initiated by Marx's theses on Feuerbach.

In Chapter 5 ("Receptive Knowledge"), Rödl outlines the anti-empiricist epistemology whose contours emerge from the previous chapters.  Knowledge of objects is receptive in that it depends on our sensory relationship with objects.  But that sensory relationship itself is known from spontaneity, in just the ways outlined in Chapters 3 and 4: it is known by virtue of a relation of knower to known which is not, itself, a matter of receptivity, but of spontaneity.  The relation is one of identity: one knows that one knows by virtue of being the knowing subject, not by virtue of being affected by her as by an object distinct from oneself.  From this Rödl derives an interesting refutation of fallibilist epistemologies and their skeptical results.  Skepticism is unavoidable unless one grasps that a concept of knowledge (spontaneous knowledge of receptive knowledge) includes its reality.  It remains of course that the power of knowledge that is both a power of receptive knowledge of objects and a power of spontaneous knowledge of the connection of receptive knowledge to its objects, is essentially fallible: this is precisely what makes it a finite, receptive power rather than a divine power of intuition of the whole at one glance.  But this does not deprive it of the status of power of knowledge: radical skepticism is a non-starter.

Finally, in Chapter 6 ("The Second Person") Rödl argues that knowledge of other thinking subjects is what he calls "second person knowledge," in which a knowing subject knows another knowing subject as standing under the same rational order of reason and the same objective, practical life form under which she knows herself by first-person, spontaneous knowledge.  Second person knowledge is thus spontaneous knowledge in just the same way in which first person knowledge is.  Both are knowledge of one and the same order of reason, which is itself the ultimate cause of actions and beliefs.  This is perhaps the most extraordinary thesis of the book:  the formal order under which subjects stand is not just an order under which causes of action and belief are determined.  It is itself the ultimate cause of actions and beliefs, insofar as it is the ultimate answer to the question "why?" one asks when inquiring about the cause of particular actions and beliefs.  Moreover, those who stand under that order mutually determine their respective first person knowledge by addressing each other, in thought and language, as "you."  It's a mistake, according to Rödl, to have focused the analysis of personal pronouns on the distinction between first person and third person knowledge.  Before the third person comes the second person.  The mutual determination of "I"-thoughts and "you"-thoughts entails that both are, in the same sense and as belonging to one and the same order of reason, referring terms the use of which is grounded on spontaneous knowledge.

There are so many new and challenging ideas in this book that one can only scratch the surface of the questions one would like to ask.  Let me start with the last point, the relation between first person and second person knowledge.  It's one thing to say that the referential rule of the use of "you" depends, just like the referential rule of the use of "I," on a "mode of presentation" or "logical perspective" on their respective objects, which itself depends on a way of knowing it: knowing it under an order of reason, which is the same for both.  Isn't it another thing to say that "you"-thoughts are spontaneous in just the same way in which "I"-thoughts are spontaneous?  At the beginning of the book, Rödl defined spontaneous knowledge as knowledge gained by virtue of a relation of identity between knower and known.  Surely the relation to the object referred to by "you" is not a relation of identity.  Rödl himself characterizes it, in good Fichtean-Hegelian tradition, as a relation of recognition.  Shouldn't he tell us more about the difference (however mutually determining they are) between the two relations?  Is it enough to say, as he does, that spontaneous knowledge just is knowledge of its referent as an element of a manifold of instances of a common order?

A second question concerns Rödl's characterization of the order of reason as the "ultimate cause" both of belief and action.  He contrasts his view to those of Brandom and of Moran, according to whom only attitudes or states of mind are properly speaking causes of action.  Of course they are such in accordance with their specific place in a causal (normative) order.  But the order itself, the order of thought or reason, is not thereby a cause.  Yes it is, replies Rödl, indeed the order of reason is the ultimate cause of action.  In fact, in this regard the situation is no different than what it is in the natural order, where natural laws are, in a sense, ultimate causes.  Why did the glass break?  Because glass is brittle: here one appeals not to a particular event or state of affairs, but to a law.  But isn't there an equivocation on the term "cause" here?  It is not enough, to call them causes, that both natural law and order of reason can be the answer to a question "why?" (why did the glass break?  Why did you act in this way?).  Stipulating that anything counting as an answer to the question "why?" thereby counts as a cause seems unhelpful.

Let me mention just one more question -- there could be many more, a tribute to the sheer richness of the book.  However impressive Rödl's account of the essential connection between first-person knowledge, reason, and the causal explanation specific to belief and action (a causal explanation which includes a normative account of holding a belief because it is true, and engaging in an action because it is good), one cannot help wondering whether a reductive account of all of these could not be given, in one fell swoop.  Rödl writes: 

It has been held that, since its essential normativity cannot be accommodated within the natural sciences, we might be forced to throw the concept of action and with it action concepts on the trash heap of outdated theories.  With action concepts a logical basis of first person thought disappears.  Renouncing action concepts is a form of self-annihilation: logical self-annihilation.  It annihilates a source of the power to think and say 'I'.  (p.63)

Well, perhaps.  But both concepts (action, "I") might remain as necessary illusions or, more charitably, necessary modes of presentations, to be explained in terms of non-normative, non-first-person thought.  Rödl has mounted an impressive account of first-person knowledge and the conceptual context in which it belongs.  He may also have mounted a pretty unimpeachable case for the indispensable role of this whole set of concepts in our objective life form.  Whether he has also reduced the bite of someone who would claim to give an account of this life form in terms of natural laws, I am not so sure.  Whatever the answer to this last question, his book is an impressive achievement, a remarkable instance of what Rödl describes as "an attempt to recover and rejuvenate the achievement of the German idealist tradition."