David Woodruff Smith


David Woodruff Smith, Husserl, Routledge, 2007, 467pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415289757.

Reviewed by Wayne M. Martin, University of Essex

On a number of occasions in his new book, David Woodruff Smith illustrates his analysis with reference to a toy proposition: "Aristotle is synoptic."  If being a synoptic philosopher means having not only a large corpus but also systematic and fundamental engagement across the full range of philosophical inquiry, then it is fair to say that Husserl too is synoptic, and that Smith has managed to obtain an impressively synoptic view.  The Husserl presented here is not narrowly a phenomenologist, but in equal parts a philosopher of language and logic, a contributor to set-theory, an ontologist, epistemologist, mereologist, and even -- in a tantalizing final chapter - a value theorist of sorts.  The accounting Smith gives of all this goes a long way toward showing the fundamental unity in all these projects; moreover it systematically resists the old picture of Husserl lurching through a series of conversions -- from psychologism to anti-psychologism, from realism to idealism, and so on.  Smith's Husserl lays down a fundamental position on a range of fundamental issues in his Logical Investigations, including a meta-theory of the unity of his various bodies of doctrine; in large measure he remains true to those commitments through the remainder of his career.  Obviously this is a lot to cover even in a large book (nearly 500 pages), and at places one feels the lack of closer scrutiny, supporting evidence, or critical assessment.  But the book fulfills its aims admirably, providing an advanced introductory survey of the whole of Husserl's vast empire, together with provocative and illuminating interventions on a number of important particular points and disputes.  But in the end the very clarity of the vision presented here also serves to bring some of the vulnerabilities of Husserl's position into sharp relief.

Husserl's empire may be vast, but it has a center nonetheless.  For Smith the Husserlian capital can be called (perhaps anachronistically), "Semantics."  Semantics is the theory of meaning, and in one way or another Husserl's myriad concerns come back to a concern with the structures which confer and sustain meaning.  This concern with meaning has an obvious application in connection with Husserl's theory of language, but it is no less a focus for his philosophical logic, ontology, phenomenology and what Husserl himself called "axiology" (value theory).  In all these areas Husserl tends to bypass traditional questions (or to broach them only indirectly) in favor of an approach which focuses on the structures of meaning in one or another domain.  Phenomenology, on this approach, is not to be cast as the study of qualia, but as (so to speak) an attempt to provide a semantics for conscious experience -- an account of how conscious experience bears meaning, both in general and in the particular ways that it does.  Smith insists, however, that this centrality of Husserl's theory of meaning should not be mistaken for the claim that it has the status of a foundational first philosophy in anything like the traditional sense -- Husserl's reputation to the contrary notwithstanding.  In one of the helpful refrains of the book, Smith consistently interprets Husserl's foundationalism in light of his mereological theory, and in particular in light of his theory of "dependent parts" or "moments."  Semantics is accorded the primary place in Husserl's theory insofar as it is that portion of the overall theory which plays an indispensable role in all the other parts.  This is not to say that those other parts can be derived from it, or indeed that the semantic theory is viable without itself depending on other commitments in the overall theory.

One such further commitment is unmistakably ontological.  For the theory of meaning, as Husserl develops it, is organized around a commitment to what he calls "ideal" or "abstract" entities.  What happens when two people think the same thought?  How does the study of inference (logic) differ from the study of psychic processes (psychology)?  How does consciousness bear intentional content?  What are the relata in proofs?  How does one experience verify or fulfill another?  For Husserl, the answers to these and a host of other questions are framed with reference to "ideal" entities:  timeless abstract objects which play an indispensable role in the multifaceted business of meaning.  The proposition "Aristotle is synoptic" is one such entity.  A series of sounds I utter or marks I inscribe refers to a state of affairs only in virtue of expressing this abstract content.  That content, according to Husserl, is not itself located in space and time (it is not a "real object" in Husserl's terminology), nor is it a private content of my own "psychic sphere" (it is not "reell" either).  It is a timeless, abstract, "ideal" entity, constituted as the entity it is in part by its relations to other such idealities -- e.g., its entailing the truth of "Someone is synoptic."  Moreover, it is not simply sounds and inkmarks that can be the bearer of ideal content.  The intentional content of conscious experience is also ideal in just this sense.  When Husserl and Smith look out their respective windows and see a tree in the garden, the fleeting private flux of subjective conscious experience relates to a physical organic object in the garden only in virtue of its bearing an abstract content -- the same abstract content that can figure in subsequent perceptual acts and admits of expression in language.  In short, an ontology of abstract entities is the preferred currency in the semantic economy of Husserl's realm.

There will no doubt be those for whom this sort of metaphysical price tag will already place Husserl's semantic approach beyond the pale.  But it seems dogmatic to reject Husserl's position out of hand simply on the basis of its ontological commitments.  If we are willing to accept whatever entities need to be posited for, say, an empirically adequate physics or cosmology, then there seems no reason in principle why Husserl's semantic sciences should be held to a different standard.  If the best available theories of language, logic, consciousness and intentionality turn on an appeal to ideal entities, then that seems a pretty good reason to posit ideal entities.  But even for those willing in principle to travel Husserl's ontologically rich route, there are a number of crucial questions that need to be addressed.  For my purposes here I confine my attention to three, considering in each case how Smith handles some of Husserl's nitty gritty.  In doing so I can only scratch the surface of this impressive and useful book, but I shall hope at least to indicate both the texture of Smith's accomplishment and the further work towards which it points.

A first issue to consider may in the end be nothing more than a matter of labeling, but it is an annoying anomaly in Husserl's published writings nonetheless.  Given the general strategy of Husserlian semantics, it seems natural to describe his avowed position as an example -- indeed an exemplar -- of what is commonly known as "Platonism".  Like Frege's appeal to the "Third Realm" and Lotze's seductive invocation of "die Ideenwelt" ("The World of Ideas", the theme of an elegant and influential essay incorporated into his 1874 Logic), Husserl addresses the various problems of semantics by postulating a realm of non-physical objects, which in turn play the role of truth-makers in logical and phenomenological investigations.  Yet again and again Husserl bristles at the characterization of his views as Platonistic.  In the first of the Logical Investigations he denies that his abstract meanings are "objects which, though existing nowhere in the world, have being in a topos ouranios" (Inv. I, §32); in the second Investigation he insists that to talk of meanings as ideal objects "is not to talk of a metaphysical doctrine" (Inv. II, Introduction).  In Ideas he devotes a short and angry section to those critics who have denounced his position as "Platonizing realism" and "perverse Platonic hypostatization" (Ideas I, §22).  But in each case these disavowals come immediately on the heels of forceful and uncompromising arguments intended to establish the necessity of recognizing timeless abstract objects in semantic inquiries.  If the Platonic shoe fits, why does Husserl decline to wear it?

Here is one area where Smith's synoptic approach might allow us to make some progress.  In this case Smith approaches the commitments of Husserlian semantics with a close eye on the details of his ontological theory.  These details can at times be rather daunting, but to neglect them is to run the risk of distorting the ontological commitments of his various semantic projects.  First, we must be clear that in appealing to meanings as ideal objects or entities, Husserl is using "object" [Gegenstand] in a maximally broad sense.  To be an object in this broad sense is simply to be "a subject of a true (categorical, affirmative) statement" (Ideas I, §22).  If there are objective truths about, say, the Pythagorean Theorem or pi or Middle C, then in the language of Husserlian ontology these are objects.  Does this mean that Husserl is guilty of "Platonizing reification"?  Not if reification means treating something as a real object.  In Husserlian ontology, a real object has spatio-temporal location; numbers and propositions and Middle C assuredly do not.  These latter are objects in Husserl's broad sense, but they are not things [Dinge], and they have no location.  As Smith puts the point:  "[T]he objection to Husserl's doctrine of essence as Platonic hypostatizing rests on a confusion of formal and material categories.  … [I]f you think that an eidos must be in space-time if it is to be tied to a real object, then you have missed the point of the categorical distinction between Fact and Essence" (161).

I shall return presently to the important issue about how ideal entities can be "tied to a real object", but we should first take stock of just how far this strategy goes in extricating Husserl from the anomaly over his apparent Platonism.  The extrication is most effective, it seems to me, in those cases where Husserl associates Platonism specifically with the notion of some "topos ouranios" [heavenly place] or "divine mind" where ideal objects are to be found.  If we take this language very literally, then it would seem to imply that ideal objects have some super-mundane location; this would indeed be to elide the ontological difference upon which Husserl so vigorously insists.  Smith:  "For Husserl, meanings are objects, all right …  But that does not imply an existence in a far-away heaven of Platonic ideas" (280).  Even granting this point, however, the anomaly does not go away.  Even the crudest Platonist will surely use the idea of a "Platonic Heaven" at most only metaphorically.  And all will surely grant that there is a difference of ontological kind between the being of Platonic entities and the being of mundane physical reality; that, presumably, is the point of Platonism!  In this connection it is worth noting that Lotze, in his defense of Platonism, explicitly relies on the fact that "validities" (as he calls them) lack spatio-temporal location.  But even setting aside these quibbles about Platonic ontology, there remains a residual anomaly within Husserl's published texts.  Recall that the second Logical Investigation denies that the theory of ideal meanings is intended as a metaphysical theory at all.  Here is the passage in full: "To talk of idealism is of course [sic!] not to talk of a metaphysical doctrine, but of a theory of knowledge which recognizes the ideal as a condition for the possibility of objective knowledge in general, and does not interpret it away in psychologistic fashion" (Husserliana XIX/1, 112).  This is surely more than a rejection of a literalist construal of the topos ouranios; it sounds like the claim that semantics and epistemology can be metaphysically neutral.  But this is, to say the least, hard to square with the details of Husserl's theory.  I suppose it might be possible to find some distinction between ontology (which both Smith and Husserl commend) and metaphysics, which Husserl here eschews.  But Smith denies himself this escape route by explicitly equating the two (53).

Let me now turn to explore two closely related issues that go beyond these matters of labeling, staying close to the intersection of semantic, ontological and phenomenological issues that Smith explores so effectively.  When someone sees a tree in the garden or judges that Aristotle is synoptic, they undergo, on Husserl's account, certain psychological changes; in particular, their conscious experience changes.  But as we have seen, Husserl holds that narrowly psychological events are intentionally related to objects (or objective states of affairs) only in virtue of their bearing ideal content.  A certain play of sights and sounds amounts to an act of seeing a tree in the garden only in virtue of its somehow bearing the content, "seeing a tree in the garden."  This content must be ideal, it seems, since the very same content figures as the content of Husserl's experience in Freiburg in the early 20th century and then again for Smith on the California coast nearly a century later.  In order to know what we are buying with such an account, we need to know (first) just what this abstract content is and (second) what our mode of relation is to it.  In particular, we are owed more than the merely negative claim that it is not spatio-temporally located, and we need to know how we finite, spatio-temporal entities relate to and know about it -- in short, how is it significant for us?

These are the sorts of questions that are usually broached in order to reduce Platonists to an embarrassed silence.  Few, presumably, will want to follow Plato's own solution to these problems in terms of an ethereal prenatal acquaintance.  But Smith shows that Husserl is neither embarrassed nor silenced by such questions, and he devotes considerable attention to reconstructing the nuances of Husserl's answer.  Or perhaps we should say: answers.  For this is the one topic where Smith explicitly qualifies his general thesis about the continuity of Husserl's thought.  In an elegant analysis, Smith documents and explains the changes in Husserl's answers to these questions, and in doing so plots the development of Husserl's increasingly nuanced semantic ontology and phenomenological methodology.  I found Smith's accounting of these changes illuminating and persuasive, but I also want to suggest that they leave Husserl's sympathizers with a residual dilemma.  Let me try to explain what I mean.

Husserl's earliest answers to our two questions are framed around an ontology of species or types (Spezies), famously illustrated with the example of the red slips of paper.  Each red slip is a discrete instance of the species or kind, red.  Of course each slip has its own spatio-temporal location; but there is also the species red, which is encountered in each individual slip, is not itself spatio-temporally located, and (adapting one of Husserl's vivid criteria) would not itself burn if we threw all the red slips in the fire.  The species counts as an object by Husserl's permissive standard (there are affirmative categorical truths about it), but it is ontologically distinctive in its ideality.  Exploiting this ontology of species, Husserl proposes the following basic framework for analyzing the semantic/intentional structure of experience.  When you and I each independently assent to the Pythagorean Theorem or see a tree in the garden, we independently instantiate the same semantic/intentional content:  the Pythagorean Theorem; seeing a tree in the garden.  Our respective acts of assent or perception are particular, spatio-temporally located events in the lives of real, finite individuals; but the intentional contents of our experiences are ideal species.  Crucially, it is these ideal species that, according to Husserl, are the primary bearers of inferential relations, which themselves obtain quite independently of whether I manage to recognize them.  This ensures that the truths of logic and phenomenology (and the semantic domain generally) hold independently of the contingent facts of psychology, as Husserl insists they must.  So in answer to the first question (what is the ontological character of semantic idealities?) the Husserl of 1900-01 has a concise answer:  the ideal objects required for semantics are species.  One merit of this answer to the ontological question is that it seems to offer an equally concise answer to the second question as well.  How do we physical, spatio-temporally located entities have access to these timeless, abstract universalities?  Husserl's answer:  we instantiate them.  The type may be timeless and abstract, but it is nonetheless present in each of its tokens and accordingly available for study by finite human beings with the power of abstraction.  As Smith puts it at one point:   "The tree belongs to the biological species Eucalyptus globulus.  That species -- with its defining features including phenotypical characters and phylogenetic descent -- is an essence analyzed in biology.  By contrast, my experience belongs to the experiential species Seeing-A-Tree or (if only we spoke this way) Perceptio arboretus.  That species of experience is analyzed in phenomenology …" (256).

For better or for worse, however, Husserl did not stick with these answers.  By the time of Ideas I, we are introduced to new answers, now framed in terms of the elusive and controversial concept of a noema.  Here we must exercise care.  Husserl does not abandon his commitment to an ontology that includes species (and numbers and manifolds and other abstract objects); Husserl was never a nominalist.  Neither does Husserl abandon his general program of what we might call 'semantic idealism':  the strategy of invoking abstract entities in the course of identifying and articulating the structures and conditions of meaning.  For Husserl both early and late, semantic idealities are the medium in which consciousness relates to an object; Smith calls this "Husserl's basic story of intentionality" (257).

So why the shift to the noema?  Smith's explanation is that Husserl came to realize that his original semantic theory had invoked the wrong abstract entities.  To adapt an idiom from British political rhetoric: species are not fit for purpose.  In particular they are not fit to fulfill the semantic purposes Husserl had originally assigned to them.  Smith:

[B]y the time of Ideas I, Husserl had come to think of meanings or senses as their own kind of ideal object, deserving their own name, 'noema.'  Husserl does not give an explicit argument for this change of status; he merely specifies that there is a correlation between an act and its noema, where the noematic sense in an act is cited as 'the object as intended.'  The best argument for Husserl's new position, it seems to me, is that species and senses have different ontological roles.  A species is instantiated by a moment in an object that is a member of the species.  By contrast, a sense represents or means an object, that is, it semantically or intentionally prescribes an object, and often prescribes it as having certain 'determinations' or properties.  Instantiation is part of the structure of essences in general, while semantic representation is part of the structure of intentionality, quite a distinct feature of the world.  … Whatever else we are to say of noemata, for Husserl an act's noema is an ideal meaning entity, distinct in kind from any ideal essence.  (155)

I find this an illuminating and persuasive account of Husserl's change of vocabulary and position, although (as Smith himself admits) it goes beyond anything Husserl actually says in his rather voluminous corpus.  For despite all the elegance of the early position, there was indeed an important sense in which it remained unsatisfying.  Recall that the abstracta of the Logical Investigations were introduced to fill a semantic role:  to explain the formal structure of various meaning-involving phenomena.  How can you and I mean the same thing despite the manifold differences in our psychological states?  Answer:  we instantiate the same species.  How does a subjective conscious state present an objective state of affairs?  Answer:  it instantiates an abstract timeless species with objective representational content and inferential significance.  The problem is not so much that these solutions can seem cheap, but that they leave a residual difficulty in their wake.  To see this it is important to remember that our conscious states at any given moment instantiate indefinitely many different types or species.  This one occurring for you right now, for example, is an instance of the type "conscious state occurring while thinking about Smith's book."  But it also instantiates "conscious state occurring more than a million years after the emergence of life on Earth," and so on.  The point here is that instantiation of a species can occur without this meaning anything for the one who does the instantiating.  Accordingly, we seem to require some supplementary account of how instantiating a species can itself be meaningful.  But here we must remember that we invested in Husserl's expensive semantic ontology precisely because it promised an account of how mental states (and inscriptions, utterances, etc.) are meaningful.  If these ontological resources still leave the problem of meaning unsolved (now in the guise of the problem of meaningful instantiation) then we are likely to suffer a severe case of buyer's regret.

Now one might at this juncture decide to abandon semantic idealism altogether.  That is, one might decide to tackle the problems of semantics without the help of accretions to one's ontology.  But this is neither Husserl's way nor Smith's.  Instead they propose to expand their ontological commitments even further.  In addition to species or essences, we now posit noemata as well.  Like species, noemata are timeless abstract objects (in the maximally permissive sense) lacking spatial location.  Like species they can retain their identity across quite disparate contexts (time, space, conscious subjects, associated imagery, etc.).  But unlike species they are not to be understood as universals or types.  Rather, a noema is a sui generis abstract object that, as Smith puts it, "semantically or intentionally prescribes an object."

So where does this leave us?  This is not the place to attempt a full adjudication of Husserl's mature semantic ontology, nor indeed of Smith's subtle reconstruction.  But one or two comments are perhaps in order.  Some may complain that there is something of a Molière Problem here -- as if we might explain the phenomena of meaning by postulating an entity defined as an object-that-means.  But Smith shows rather effectively, I think, that this is a red herring.  After all, even Molière's tautological appeal to the dormative virtue can turn out to be explanatorily fruitful if one goes on to specify just how that virtue does its dormative work.  Smith shows that Husserl's semantic case studies go a long way towards meeting this standard.  But even if the allegation of explanatory vacuity is met, we are still owed an answer to the second of the two questions we have been considering.  Given Husserl's new answer about the ontological status of semantic idealities, what are we to say about our mode of access to them?

It is just at this point, I think, that Husserl's sympathizers face a dilemma, brought into sharp relief by Smith's precise and synoptic accounting.  Either we retain the semantic ontology of the Investigations or we move with Smith and Husserl to the ontology of noemata from Ideas.  In the first case, we have an elegant solution to the problem of access to the semantic idealities, but we are left with what I have here called the problem of meaningful instantiation.  In the latter case we avoid the problem of meaningful instantiation, but we sacrifice the elegant solution to the problem of access.  If we choose the second horn then we need an account of how a finite, spatio-temporally located, embodied human subject enters into semantic commerce with abstract, timeless entities conceived as noemata.  Smith has at least two things to say to this issue, but I cannot see that either of them suffices.  One might appeal to Husserl's doctrine of intuition, understood as a custom-designed, plug-in epistemic capacity meant to sustain Husserl's ontological commitments.  Husserl's notion of intuition has been much derided, but Smith argues that it is nothing more outré than the capacity for abstraction.  (See, e.g., 141, and a more extensive discussion in Chapter 7.)  This strikes me as a useful move only in support of the ontology of the Investigations.  One can indeed move from knowledge of a particular to knowledge of a universal or species by a process of abstraction.  But I fail to see how intuition, so construed, can help with the ontology of noemata as Smith understands it.  Recall Smith's point:  "Whatever else we are to say of noemata, for Husserl an act's noema is an ideal meaning entity, distinct in kind from any ideal essence" (cited above, emphasis here added).  If a noema is not an ideal essence then one surely cannot become acquainted with it by mere abstraction (or imaginative variation, etc.).  The other available move -- one that Husserl himself exploits -- is to appeal to a "correlation" between the act of meaning (the noesis) and the meaning (the noema) that provides its content.  But this threatens to reproduce more problems than it solves.  Where we earlier encountered the problem of meaningful instantiation, we will now encounter the problem of meaningful correlation.  After all, correlation is an even more promiscuous relationship than instantiation.  Anything can be correlated with anything else.  So while we can grant that there is a correlation between a finite embodied act of consciousness and its disembodied noematic correlate, we find ourselves with the residual problem of explaining how such a correlation is meaningful or significant for the one who gets correlated.  But isn't this effectively where we came in?