2003.03.13

Pascal Engel

Truth

Engel, Pascal, Truth, Acumen Press, 2002, 184pp, $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 1902683579.

Reviewed by Richard Rorty, Stanford University


Pascal Engel, who teaches at the Sorbonne, is one of the leading figures in the ongoing attempt to make the disciplinary matrix of French philosophy more like that of Anglo-American philosophy, and to get French philosophers to take seriously the problems discussed by their Anglophone colleagues. In this book, he offers a clear, succinct, and very useful review of discussions of the concept of truth by such figures as Moore, Ramsey, Strawson, Davidson, Wright, Rorty, Horwich, and Putnam.

Engel thinks it important to acknowledge the advantages of deflationist views—views that take truth as a primitive and unanalyzable notion—but equally important to block the road from deflationism to positions (such as Foucault’s, Latour’s and Rorty’s) that smack of “nihilism”, “skepticism”, and “relativism”. So he formulates and defends a compromise position that he calls “minimal realism”.

Engel agrees with Wright,

if we described the practice of a community who had a device of assertion without mentioning that assertions aim at truth, or if we described people as having beliefs without these aiming at truth, our description would be incomplete and inadequate. (92)

But he differs from Wright in insisting, “the norm of truth is the norm of realist, recognition-transcendent truth”. (93) For “a minimalism about truth does not imply a minimalism about truth-aptness”. In each domain of inquiry, “truth-aptness is to be judged after the realist criterion of the independence of a domain from our responses”. (89) So we have to “reconcile our epistemology of the concepts involved in each domain with the account of the truth of propositions involving them”. (123)

Engel says, “deflationism about truth pays a lot of dividends, but it has to pay the price”. (56) One such price is being unable to account for “the fact that truth is the point of assertion”. He cites Dummett as saying that omitting the fact that assertion and belief aim at truth is “like omitting the fact that the purpose of playing a game is to win it”. (58) Another price is leaving us unable to compare the status of truths in one domain (say science) to that of truth in another domain (say ethics, or fiction). Still another is an inability to handle the distinction between metaphorical and literal truth. “If some sentences fail to be literally true or to be apt for truth, the deflationist should give us an account of this.” (59)

Engel grants that some deflationists, such as Rorty, are willing to “bite the bullet”, claiming that it is a virtue of their view that it sweeps aside these and other traditional distinctions, thereby dissolving many traditional philosophical problems. But he rightly points out, “the sophisticated attempts of analytic philosophers at constructing minimalist theories of truth” do not “automatically lead to the kind of nihilism and skepticism illustrated by Rorty”. “There is”, he rightly says, “a theoretical ambition in the former that is absent from the latter”. (63)

Engel has two sorts of arguments against deflationism. The first consists in pointing out that deflationists cannot accept certain familiar platitudes, such as that inquiry converges to truth, or that true sentences have a relation called “correspondence” to their subjects that false sentences do not. The other sort is metaphilosophical: “The reason why you need to have a robust conception of truth condition is … that minimalism about truth-aptness robs all sorts of debates of any sense”. (119)

If those debates are held to be pointless, any “theoretical ambition” one might have had in this area of inquiry will quickly drain away.

The first set of arguments relies on the reader agreeing that it would be absurd to abandon a certain intuition. The second rely on her agreeing that it would be absurd to claim that a certain long-lasting philosophical debate should never have been begun. Neither can be conclusive, since a hardened bullet-biter will always try to make a virtue of necessity. He will urge that letting go of certain intuitions, or letting certain debates lapse, is the price of intellectual progress. Arguments about what does and does not constitute such progress are about as inconclusive as philosophical arguments can get.

This inconclusiveness is best illustrated by reflection on the upshot of the metaphilosophical portions of Engel’s book, particularly chapter 4, “The realist/anti-realist controversies”. Here Engel points out how many of the controversies between analytic philosophers presuppose that some parts of culture are more truth-apt than others. The blithe indifferentism of Arthur Fine’s “NOA” (the Natural Ontological Attitude, which many deflationists adopt) “threatens to undercut all epistemological questions about scientific theories”. (105) Again, “if there is no way of distinguishing description of matters of fact from expression of attitudes, any sort of meta-ethical view, be it realist or anti-realist, is absurd.” (109)

Engel’s French colleagues who doubt that contemporary Anglophone philosophy is a model worthy of imitation can accept everything Engel says about the need for a notion of truth-aptness if we are to keep epistemology and meta-ethics going. But they will then reverse the argument. Since those sub-disciplines have degenerated into terminal dreariness, they will say, it would be a good idea to get rid of truth-aptness, thereby hastening their demise. Skeptics of this sort can happily agree with Engel that “most of the history of twentieth-century analytic philosophy is a sort of battlefield opposing various “realist” and “anti-realist” conceptions of truth”. (4) But they think that the battlefield has been trampled into a quagmire.