2008.02.03

R. E. Houser (ed.)

Laudemus Viros Gloriosos: Essays in Honor of Armand Maurer, CSB

R. E. Houser (ed.), Laudemus Viros Gloriosos: Essays in Honor of Armand Maurer, CSB, University of Notre Dame Press, 2007, 395pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780268031039.

Reviewed by Alexander Fidora, Universitat Autònoma de Barcelona


This volume is dedicated to one of the most outstanding historians of medieval philosophy of our time:  Armand Maurer.

The Festschrift contains fifteen essays, all written by renowned scholars working in the field of medieval philosophy and theology, many of them pupils of Maurer at the Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies in Toronto where, after being educated there by Gilson and others, Maurer taught for many years.

The essays are complemented by Houser’s introduction which presents Maurer's intellectual journey and by a final chapter containing Maurer’s own reflections on what he describes as his formative years. The introduction by Houser is both a well-done presentation of Maurer’s work and a sound introduction to the collection of essays, since most of them reflect very closely Maurer's own interests: Thomistic philosophy, Franciscan thought, and the concept of Christian philosophy.

One group of essays, by R. E. Houser, Leo J. Elders, Lawrence Dewan, David B. Twetten, Mary C. Sommers and James P. Reilly, considers different aspects of Aquinas's philosophy and theology. Houser revisits the real distinction between essence and existence in Avicenna and Aquinas. He does so in a new and convincing way, placing the question in the larger context of how metaphysics arrives at its principles. Houser argues that these principles are neither demonstrated conclusions nor unproven theses, but that they are obtained through dialectical argumentation. Leo J. Elders tackles the question of how faith and reason are related to each other in Aquinas. In attempting to answer this question, he outlines a remarkable synthesis of Aquinas's thought, stressing, above all, the importance of the reception of Aristotle's philosophy through the translations by James of Venice, Michael Scot and Gerard (not Roland, as Elders writes) of Cremona. According to Elders, this philosophical tradition is the very basis for Christian theology as a science. Lawrence Dewan discusses Aquinas's key concept, analogy. Dewan wishes, in particular, to refute Ralph McInerny's reinterpretation of analogy, so he focuses on a passage from the Sentences-Commentary 1.19 which is central to McInerny's interpretation.  He endeavors to show, setting Cajetan against the claims of McInerney, that this passage is meant to be a classification of the types of analogy of names. David B. Twetten takes up a much debated issue concerning Aquinas's proofs for God's existence. A very common objection against these proofs has been that they are not conclusive because, even if they show the existence of something, there remains an unbridged gap between what they show and Aquinas's final identification of this 'x' with God. Twetten insists, on the contrary, that this is not a shortcoming of Aquinas's account, but rather an achievement of his philosophical theology, which does not resort to a semantically loaded prescriptive concept of God, but rather looks for the lowest common denominator for different views. Mary C. Sommers analyzes Aquinas's treatise Contra impugnantes (c. 1256) in defense of non-secular masters (like Aquinas himself) teaching at the University. Her interpretation focuses on the question of whether Aquinas's defense included all types of religious teachers, i.e,. the different orders, or whether it was merely a justification for having Dominicans lecture at the University. In her conclusion, she sides with Michel-Marie Dufeil to the effect that Aquinas was not only defending the Mendicants, but also the other orders. James P. Reilly contributes a brief note on some passages from Aquinas's commentary on De divinis nominibus and the way in which Aquinas conceives of the relation between different types of governance and love.

A second group of essays is made up of studies relating to the Franciscan tradition, as well as to certain authors of a similar bent, and includes articles by R. James Long, John F. Wippel, Timothy B. Noone, Steven F. Brown, Calvin G. Normore, Girard J. Etzkorn and Norman Wells.  R. James Long edits and examines Richard Fishacre's and Richard Rufus's respective commentaries on the Sentences 25.1, dealing with the possibility of altering the past. Long shows that Rufus's commentary (edited from one Oxford manuscript) is a direct reply to the arguments previously voiced by Fishacre (edited from six manuscripts). John F. Wippel comments on Godfrey of Fontaines's strong interest in the Condemnation of 1277 and the authors it most affected. Wippel analyzes several passages from Godfrey's Quodlibeta, ranging from 1288 to 1297/1298. He points out that Godfrey was very critical with regard to some of the condemned articles and called for the condemnation of, at least, some of the articles to be revised. Timothy B. Noone takes two emblematic Franciscans, Matthew of Aquasparta and Peter John Olivi, and analyzes their attitudes towards philosophy: a more moderate one in the case of Matthew and a more critical one in that of Olivi. In both cases, however, Noone shows that neither simply excluded philosophical arguments, even though they clearly restricted the validity of those arguments to certain domains. The concept of philosophy which they adopt is indebted to the Augustinian tradition. Stephen F. Brown edits and discusses an interesting text by Peter of Gandia which gives insight into discussions about faith and reason in the late 13th century. The text, from Peter's Commentary on the Sentences, is edited from a single Vatican manuscript, Cod. Lat. 1081 (though Brown supplies further readings from a manuscript receiving the vague designation: "P").  It quotes the names and opinions of Malivus a Sancto-Adomaro, Gerardus de Calcar, Lambertus de Marchia and Franciscus de Sancto-Michaele; it. As for the development of the literary genus of the commentaries on the Sentences in general, Brown remarks that one can observe a trend leading from discussions of Patristic views in 13th-century commentaries to a stronger engagement with contemporary opponents and a focus on the burning issues of the day in the 14th century. Stressing the systematic importance of a historical discussion of contingency, Calvin G. Normore reconstructs the history of this notion by starting with Aquinas and following up with a discussion of Scotus and Ockham. As Normore is able to show, the pivotal point in this discussion was temporality, an element which, after Ockham, would be eclipsed in every respect. Girard J. Etzkorn offers an edition of a hitherto unknown text on cognition, more specifically on abstractive and intuitive-abstractive knowledge. The text is preserved in a single Vatican manuscript and bears no attribution; Etzkorn, however, identifies Francis Mayronis as its possible author. Finally, Norman Wells turns to another Franciscan author, Bartholomew Mastrius a 17th century thinker who defended the Scotist concept of esse cognitum.

There are two additional essays.  Richard C. Taylor examines the famous question of "double truth" in Averroes. He concludes that religion can be called 'true', even when it conflicts with philosophical demonstration, insofar and only insofar as it has some practical value in guiding man towards moral virtue. The other essay, the volume’s initial one, is by John M. Rist.  His aim is to disclose the "original nature of Christian philosophy", a nature that would be determined, according to Rist, by the recourse Christian theologians, such as Justin Martyr, had to Middle Platonism. At the end of his article, Rist claims that this recourse was not "merely a function of the prevailing conditions of an age", but that it has a "deeper significance" (p. 34).

This claim raises an important question, important for both Maurer's work and this volume itself, namely the controversial issue of "Christian philosophy". Rist seems to hold that Christian philosophy is Platonic in essence; Elders suggests that Aristotelian philosophy (as developed by Aquinas) is the only philosophy which may be of use in the study of theology (p. 118) or, at least, "the best and safest instrument to develop and construct the science of theology" (p. 127). Noone, taking a third position, shows how the Franciscans developed their own genuinely Christian style of philosophizing, a style which relied on the Augustinian tradition (p. 239).

In light of this variety -- both of phenomena and opinions -- one should be careful when making strong claims about the Christian philosophy. This is not to say that any such philosophy did not exist in the Middle Ages; rather, it is to insist on its plurality, a plurality which may also prove useful for contemporary debates. This lesson, of course, is not new: Étienne Gilson, not to mention Maurer himself, reached this conclusion many years ago.

Leaving details of interpretation to one side, however, it must be said that, all in all, this carefully organized volume offers a wide range of extremely inspiring essays which reflect many of Maurer's interests and much of his work. Laudemus viros gloriosos -- a very fitting title for this collection -- is echoed in the Book of Sirach by another verse, which states that "Et cum semine ipsorum perseverat bona” (“ Good things continue with their seed"). This volume is indeed a manifest proof that Maurer’s important work is being continued by his pupils and friends.