Jonathan Wolff, Avner de-Shalit


Jonathan Wolff and Avner de-Shalit, Disadvantage, Oxford University Press, 2007, 231pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199278268.

Reviewed by Kristin Shrader-Frechette, University of Notre Dame

What does it mean to be disadvantaged?  Can one compare different disadvantages, for instance, regarding access to education or healthcare?  How does one determine who is least advantaged?  What should governments do to avoid disadvantage and to move societies toward an equality of opportunity that is both distributive and social?  Divided into three parts and combining superb analytical political philosophy with empirical research, Disadvantage answers these four questions with respect to those in the developed world.  Part 1 builds on the capability theory of Sen and Nussbaum and provides a pluralist account of disadvantage.  Because disadvantage "clusters," so that some people are disadvantaged in several different respects, Part 2 shows how to identify the least advantaged in society.  Part 3 argues for remedying disadvantage by declustering it and by avoiding what the authors call "corrosive disadvantages," disadvantages that increase other disadvantages.

Wolff and de-Shalit have written a book which is important for both practical and theoretical reasons.  On the practical side, Disadvantage is a significant response to increasing inequality.  For instance, the U.S. Central Intelligence Agency's Factbook shows that, since the mid-1970s, U.S. rates of income inequality, child poverty, and poverty have become the worst in the industrialized world.  Without something like the philosophical justification for action, and the types of action proposed in this book, gaps between rich and poor are likely to widen and to reinforce patterns of undeserved privilege and disadvantage.  Shifting philosophical discourse on inequality away from theories about what makes people responsible and about why something is an opportunity, Wolff and de-Shalit instead move toward a more policy-oriented analysis of how to increase opportunity and reduce disadvantage.

On the theoretical side, Disadvantage is a landmark volume for at least five reasons.  First, it improves on Sen's and Nussbaum's capability approach.  It explains why disadvantage concerns not only lack of opportunity and low functioning (failure to meet basic needs in areas such as being able to live, to enjoy bodily health, and to have attachments) but also increased risks and insecurity about future functioning.  Second, by using empirical research that reveals how the most important disadvantages cluster, the book provides a solution to the indexing problem that Rawls and other theorists have recognized but not solved: how to rank members of society on a scale of advantage and disadvantage.  Third, in offering prescriptions for reducing inequality of opportunity, the book argues that government should decluster disadvantages by promoting programs that enhance functioning and by eliminating corrosive disadvantages.

Fourth, the book extends the widely accepted Rawlsian notion of (private) reflective equilibrium (in which people "test" moral beliefs against other beliefs and seek coherence among them).  It develops a method of "dynamic public reflective equilibrium" (an iterative process of interactive interviews leading to reflective equilibrium among political philosophers, social-policy experts, and -- most importantly -- those who are disadvantaged and those who serve the disadvantaged), then uses this new approach to illustrate and partly test the authors' analyses of disadvantage.

Finally, fifth, the authors advance the theoretical justification for focusing on people who are least advantaged.  They respond effectively to two main objections to this focus (that disadvantage is mainly the fault of those who are disadvantaged and that remedying disadvantage would be too expensive and inefficient).  Wolff and de-Shalit answer the first objection by showing how the clustering of disadvantage often reduces the responsibility of disadvantaged people insofar as it requires them to sacrifice one set of functionings in order to secure other functionings, such as not being hungry.  They answer the second objection by showing that many solutions to disadvantage, such as increasing affiliation through community groups and clubs, are not expensive.

Criticizing Sen's and Nussbaum's theory of functionings and their overemphasis on the liberal, autonomous individual who cares for her entitlements (rather than the active community member who participates in social projects), Wolff and de-Shalit make a compelling and insightful argument.  They show that the well being of people is also a matter of their being able to contribute to, and to shape, society.  As a result, they make a good case for adding additional categories of functioning to the Sen and Nussbaum list, e.g., doing good to others, living in a law-abiding fashion.  In providing an enriched account of human functioning, Wolff and de-Shalit deserve praise for developing a view that does a better job of recognizing the dignity of people, that does not reduce individuals to recipients of material aid, and that understands their desire to be contributing members of their community.

Wolff and de-Shalit likewise deserve praise for developing and using the method of dynamic public reflective equilibrium -- including 98 interviews of disadvantaged people and those who serve them -- to partially test and illuminate their account of essential functionings.  The fact that they used pilot interviews (to refine their concepts and approaches) also helps address worries about any possible circularity in their use of this method.  An additional way to address possible concerns about circularity might have been for the authors to specify the precise selection criteria they used for interviewees.  Still, because Wolff and de-Shalit allowed interviewees to make open-ended comments about the list of functionings, provided a copy of their written instructions to interviewees (included as an appendix to their book), and used the third series of interviews as a check on conclusions from the second series, there is no evidence either that their approach was circular or that the authors influenced the interview process in a questionable way.

Social scientists might wonder whether the authors' method of dynamic public reflective equilibrium produced any statistically significant results.  It did not, and the authors are quite clear on this point.  They deliberately made no attempt to use a uniform, closed-ended survey instrument.  Instead Wolff and de-Shalit wanted people to theorize, in an open-ended and philosophical way.  Rather than producing statistically significant results, the authors wanted to introduce and demonstrate a method, to avoid more extensive and more costly interviews, and to inspire or discover (rather than fully justify) tentative conclusions about basic needs (190).  All of these responses seem reasonable, particularly for a project which is a philosophical explanation and empirical illustration of dynamic reflective public equilibrium.

A potentially controversial aspect of the book is its embracing a pluralist account of disadvantage.  While philosophically plausible, this pluralism makes it more difficult for the authors to identify the most disadvantaged in society and to instruct government about how to ameliorate disadvantage.  Nevertheless, the authors do not support an extreme incommensurability.  They reject a monist account of disadvantage only insofar as they claim that different functionings are incommensurable in the sense that more of one does not always rectify the lack of another functioning.  They recognize that in some situations, supplying money to the disadvantaged, or more of one function, is often either the best that can be done, or the only possible remedy (96-97).

Wolff and de-Shalit offer many unique insights and powerful arguments about the clustering of disadvantage and the often inexpensive ways to remedy it, e.g., through educational stipends and community centers.  Nevertheless, the authors themselves admit that few data on disadvantage are available for use in indexing.  They also admit that, in the face of the posited incommensurability of disadvantage, research would need to be done to implement their "clustering" solution to the indexing problem and to remedy disadvantage.  Given the practical and financial difficulties that accompany doing such research, then using this research to design social policies to identify and ameliorate disadvantage, one worry is that these difficulties -- made worse by supposed incommensurability -- could be used as a governmental excuse for doing little to alleviate disadvantage.  Moreover, because pluralist accounts of disadvantage and indexing (like those of the authors) are less transparent than monistic accounts (like those involving cost-benefit analysis), they also may be less susceptible to democratic control and more susceptible to the influence of special interests.

Recognizing the preceding difficulties, what can be said for the authors' solution to the indexing problem and for their amelioration proposal?  On one hand, they have said little about how, specifically, to empirically identify and ameliorate disadvantage.  On the other hand, they have offered the York Model (110-119) as a guide to further empirical work on measuring and ameliorating disadvantage.  This provides the needed general framework to guide indexing and amelioration.  In the interests of practicality, the authors also propose using an abbreviated version of their solution to the indexing problem.  All these moves seem reasonable first steps to address a problem (identifying and ameliorating disadvantage) that, so far, has not been fully solved.  Readers also should remember that this book is the first of its kind, a landmark volume that actually develops political philosophy in significant ways, begins to test it, and suggests how to apply it, so as to promote equal opportunity.  One book cannot do everything, and this book already has done far more than most in advancing both political philosophy and practical policy strategies.

Besides the five major theoretical contributions to political philosophy (noted earlier) that Disadvantage provides, the book offers a refreshing alternative to many contemporary analytic discussions in ethics and political thought.  Typically those discussions explain their favored theory of justice or equality, then defend it by showing that alternative theories cannot handle esoteric counter-examples as well as their own theory can.  Or they show that, in bizarre circumstances, alternative accounts lead to counter-intuitive consequences, whereas their own account does not.

With the exception of theorists such as Brian Barry, Thomas Pogge, and Peter Singer, the analytic political philosophy literature often uses this counterexample-and-reformulation methodology mostly in discussing unrealistic cases.  To their credit, Wolff and de-Shalit employ this methodology to much better purpose.  They clarify cases and solutions taken from real life, cases that grapple with a major contemporary problem, inequality.  Moreover, they offer empirical research to bolster the plausibility of their theory that, even on a pluralist view, the "clustering" of disadvantage allows a practical solution to the theoretical problem of identifying and indexing disadvantage.  They also take the revolutionary and praiseworthy step of working with the disadvantaged (and those who serve them) in seeking dynamic public reflective equilibrium.

Every chapter of the book deals well with the relevant literature, whether on capability theory, the indexing problem, or clustering.  Every chapter provides thoughtful theoretical alternatives to extant views, e.g., to the choice and identification theories of opportunity and responsibility.  Every chapter ably handles the most serious objections to the positions the authors defend.  Every chapter is extraordinarily clear and well organized, with excellent summary paragraphs.  Every chapter is full of insights, such as why individuals often are forced to take risks, even when no force is used (67), or why money does not always secure functioning (149).  Every chapter is enriched by the authors' unique combination of excellent analytic philosophy and empirical research.  Most importantly, every chapter convinces readers that political philosophers can contribute not only to understanding the world but to changing it, and changing it for the better.  An idealistic book that is extraordinarily practical, it also is masterfully clear, analytically precise, and much needed in the policy arena.  Everyone concerned about poverty and inequality should read this book.