2008.02.16

Trenton Merricks

Truth and Ontology

Trenton Merricks, Truth and Ontology, Oxford University Press, 2007, 202pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199205233.

Reviewed by Ben Caplan, Ohio State University


Many have thought that, in one way or another, truth depends on being and that, although this view has its problems, holding on to the view is the only way to hold on to any metaphysically robust form of realism. For example, John Bigelow says:

[such views] breed legions of recalcitrant philosophical problems. For this reason I have sometimes tried to stop believing in [one version of the view]. Yet I have never really succeeded. Without some such [view], I find I have no adequate anchor to hold me from drifting onto the shoals of some sort of pragmatism or idealism. (The Reality of Numbers: A Physicalist's Philosophy of Mathematics [Oxford: Clarendon, 1988], 123)

In his short second book, Truth and Ontology, Trenton Merricks argues that we should give up the view that truth depends on being. (So the book could have been called Truth without Ontology.) Merricks thinks that particular positive truths about the actual present (e.g. that Ben is drinking hot chocolate at Stauf's) depend on being, but other truths -- negative truths (e.g. that there is no purple dinosaur in Ben's pocket), truths about the past (e.g. that Ben bought croissants at Tasi), modal truths in general (e.g. that Ben could've bought coffee at Tasi) and true subjunctive conditionals in particular (e.g. that Ben would have cried if he had seen the movie) -- don't. This is a bold and interesting view, one that deserves to be developed and considered. One of Merricks's arguments for it is fairly convincing. But others are less so, and it remains unclear whether Merricks's view is an adequate anchor, one that can prevent us from drifting away from realism.

1. Chapters 1-4

Merricks denies that truth invariably depends on being. But "truth depends on being" is a slogan, one that needs to be cashed out. In Chapters 1-4, Merricks considers how to do so. He discusses two ways -- one called "Truthmaker" (Chapters 1-3), the other called "Truth Supervenes on Being" (Chapter 4) -- but says that, in the end, the difference between them doesn't matter (96). Here's one way. (It's a version of what Merricks calls "Truth Supervenes on Being.")

Truth Depends on Being

For any proposition p and any world w, if p is true in w, then

(i) some object x has some property F (or some objects the xs have F, or the xs stand in some relation R) in w;

(ii) p is true in any world w* in which x has F (or in which the xs have F, or in which the xs stand in R); and

(iii) p is about x's having F (or the xs' having F, or the xs' standing in R).

If clauses (i)-(iii) are satisfied, let's say that x's having F (or the xs' having F, or the xs' standing in R) is a dependence base for the truth of p.

Clauses (i)-(ii) capture the idea that, if truth depends on being, then truth supervenes on being. But supervenience is not enough for dependence. Among other things, it is trivial that every necessary truth supervenes on being: it is trivial that, if p is true in all worlds, then p is true in w*, whether or not x has F in w*. But, one might think, it is not trivial that necessary truths depend on being (87-93; cf. 22-34). Clause (iii) is intended to help here. Admittedly, aboutness is slippery (cf. 33-34). But it seems that Fermat's Last Theorem isn't about the existence of my left thumb. So, just because the truth of Fermat's Last Theorem supervenes on the existence of my left thumb, that doesn't mean that the existence of my left thumb is a dependence base for the truth of Fermat's Last Theorem.

One might wonder whether aboutness gets at dependence, since in general that an object a's having a property P depends on another object b's having a property Q doesn't require that a be about b's having Q. In particular, one might wonder why the dependence of the truth of p on x's having F would require that p be about x's having F. But, although he usually speaks about aboutness rather than about explanation, Merricks links aboutness to explanation -- roughly, a proposition p is about x's having F if and only if x's having F explains the truth of p (30) -- and, it seems, explanation gets at dependence, since in general that a's having P depends on b's having Q does require that b's having Q explain a's having P. In fact, one might think that dependence is precisely supervenience plus explanation. To return to the earlier example, the reason that the existence of my left thumb is not a dependence base for the truth of Fermat's Last Theorem is that the existence of my left thumb doesn't explain the truth of Fermat's Last Theorem.

Merricks adds a fourth clause: (iv) F (or R) is non-suspicious (35-38, 92). But it seems that the extra clause does no extra work. It is supposed to prevent cheaters from appealing to properties like being an x such that x would've cried if x had seen the movie (35) and being an x such that x had a professional hockey team (35-36) to provide dependence bases for truths like the propositions that Ben would have cried if he had seen the movie and that Winnipeg had a professional hockey team. But it turns out that, on Merricks's view, those propositions are not about the instantiation of those properties (e.g. 133, 137, 154, 157).

In Chapters 2 and 4, Merricks offers an argument against Truth Depends on Being: negative truths are incompatible with Truth Depends on Being, since negative truths lack dependence bases; and there are negative truths; so Truth Depends on Being is false. Perhaps the truth of the proposition that there is no purple dinosaur in Ben's pocket -- call it 'No Barney' -- supervenes on my pocket's having the property being such that everything in it is a cell phone or a sunglasses case (or a proper part thereof or a fusion of parts thereof). But, Merricks argues, the truth of No Barney isn't about my pocket's having that property, in part because what explains the truth of No Barney isn't my pocket's having that property; rather, it's there being nothing more in my pocket -- or, alternatively, everything in my pocket's being a cell phone or a sunglasses case (or … ) (61-63). At this point, one might wonder what everything in my pocket's being a cell phone or a sunglasses case (or … ) is, since it's not my pocket's having the property being such that everything in it is a cell phone or a sunglasses case (or … ). I return to this question below. But I think Merricks is right about the general point: it is implausible to suppose that every negative truth is about some existing thing having some property (or some existing things having some property or standing in some relation).

2. Chapters 5-7

In Chapters 6-7, Merricks offers two further arguments against Truth Depends on Being. (I return to Chapter 5 below.) Chapter 6 is on presentism: the view that only the present is real. Some argue against presentism on the grounds that it's incompatible with Truth Depends on Being. Unlike many other presentists, Merricks agrees that presentism is incompatible with Truth Depends on Being (125-137). (Merricks's argument relies on the claim that truths about the past aren't about various proposed dependence bases. I share Merricks's intuition here.) But, instead of arguing from Truth Depends on Being to the falsehood of presentism, he argues from presentism to the falsehood of Truth Depends on Being (137-139). In a short section ("Choose Presentism," 137-142), Merricks argues for presentism by arguing against eternalism: the view that the past, the present, and the future are equally real. First, Merricks says that, like David Lewis's modal realism, eternalism "merit[s] an incredulous stare" (140). Second, Merricks argues that eternalism implies perdurantism (the view that objects exist at different times by having different temporal parts at those times) and that perdurantism is false, because it implies that I don't know that I existed yesterday (140-142). This argument relies on the claim that eternalism implies perdurantism. Merricks has argued for this claim elsewhere ("Persistence, Parts, and Presentism," Nous 33 (1999): 421-438). But not everyone accepts this claim -- indeed, many eternalists (for example, Sally Haslanger and Mark Johnston) are not perdurantists -- and those who reject it will be unmoved by Merricks's argument for presentism and hence by his argument from presentism to the falsehood of Truth Depends on Being.

Chapter 7 is on subjunctive conditionals. Merricks argues that true subjunctive conditionals (e.g. that Ben would've cried if he had seen the movie) are incompatible with Truth Depends on Being, since true subjunctive conditionals lack dependence bases; and some subjunctive conditionals are true; so Truth Depends on Being is false. Merricks's argument for the claim that true subjunctive conditionals lack dependence bases relies on the claim that the proposition that Ben would've cried if he had seen the movie is not about my actually having any modal properties (e.g. being an x such that x would've cried if x had seen the movie) (151, 157). And Merricks's argument for that claim relies on the falsehood of any account that reduces subjunctive conditionals to claims about the actual instantiation of modal properties (152-153). Merricks does not argue against any such reductive account. Further, those who accept such a reductive account are unlikely to be moved by his argument for the incompatibility of the truth of subjunctive conditionals and Truth Depends on Being and hence by his argument from the truth of subjunctive conditionals to the falsehood of Truth Depends on Being.

Chapter 5 is on modality. Merricks does not argue against Truth Depends on Being in this chapter. Rather, he argues that Truth Depends on Being is incompatible with a reductive account of de re modality. (This is not an argument against Truth Depends on Being, because Merricks thinks that de re modality is primitive.) The argument relies on the claim that, on Lewis's account, the actual truth of the proposition that Ben could've bought coffee at Tasi doesn't depend on actual being, since it depends instead on the non-actual being of one of my counterparts in another world (and that person's coffee-purchasing). Merricks says that it is a cost of Lewis's account that it is incompatible with the claim that actual truth depends on actual being (100-101). But denying that actual truth depends on actual being might seem no more costly to a Lewisian than is denying the claim that local truth depends on local being: one might think that the proposition that Stretch is the tallest person in the world is true where Stretch is, even if the truth of that proposition depends on how things are in places where Stretch is not. Merricks offers a second, more familiar argument against Lewis's account: Lewis's account is false, because it presupposes modal realism (101-102). It is perhaps best to think of this chapter as a defense, independent of Truth Depends on Being, of primitive de re modality.

3. Chapter 8

In Chapter 8, Merricks argues that truth is a primitive monadic property and that we can preserve a form of realism about truth, since biconditionals like 'That Ben is drinking hot chocolate at Stauf's is true if and only if Ben is drinking hot chocolate at Stauf's' are true. Merricks thinks that such biconditionals are true even in the case of negative truths (xiii) and truths about the past (xiii, xviii). So, for example, No Barney -- the proposition that there is no purple dinosaur in Ben's pocket -- is true if and only if there is no purple dinosaur in my pocket. Indeed, Merricks thinks that the right-hand side of such a biconditional explains the left-hand side. So, for example, No Barney is true because there is no purple dinosaur in my pocket (xiii, xvi, 110, 187). But Merricks doesn't say enough about how we are to understand such claims for their truth to serve as our anchor against the pull of pragmatism or idealism. (Perhaps realism about truth isn't supposed to be our anchor. But, if not realism about truth, then what?)

Merricks says that there is a trivial way in which truth depends on being, since No Barney is true because there is no purple dinosaur in my pocket, that Ben bought croissants at Tasi is true because I bought croissants at Tasi, and so on (xiii, xvi). (Merricks distinguishes this supposedly "trivial" way in which truth depends on being from a more "substantive" way, one that is captured by Truth Depends on Being (xiii, xvi).) But it is not clear why any of these claims is trivial. Nor is it clear why, even if they were trivial, that would show that truth depends on being. After all, nothing in Merricks's ontology is either the nonexistence of a purple dinosaur in my pocket or my past croissant-purchasing at Tasi.

Perhaps Merricks's view is that, in explaining the truth of negative truths and of truths about the past, one needs to use primitive machinery: a universal quantifier in the case of negative truths ("No Barney is true because EVERYTHING in Ben's pocket is a cell phone or a sunglasses case (or … )") and a past-tense operator in the case of truths about the past ("That Ben bought croissants at Tasi is true because IT WAS THE CASE THAT (Ben buys croissants at Tasi)"). On this view, it would be a mistake to suppose that what these bits of primitive machinery are doing when they are used to give explanations is picking out bits of reality: there is no bit of reality -- not even part of the property being such that everything in it is a cell phone or a sunglasses case (or …  ) that my pocket has -- that 'EVERYTHING' is being used to pick out in "No Barney is true because EVERYTHING in Ben's pocket is a cell phone or a sunglasses case (or … )," nor is there any bit of reality that 'IT WAS THE CASE THAT' is being used to pick out in "That Ben bought croissants at Tasi is true because IT WAS THE CASE THAT (Ben buys croissants at Tasi)." This might be Merricks's view. But I'm not sure. For one thing, he doesn't explicitly say any of this. And, for another, on this view the sense in which truth "trivially" depends on being is that it doesn't depend on being at all.

Note

Many thanks to Tim Pawl and David Sanson for comments and discussion.