2008.02.18

Alain Badiou

Being and Event

Alain Badiou, Being and Event, Oliver Feltham (tr.), Continuum, 2006, 526pp., $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780826495297.

Reviewed by Peter Dews, University of Essex


One way of locating Alain Badiou's magnum opus (first published in 1988, as L'être et l'évènement) on the large-scale map of modern philosophical endeavour would be to look back to mid-nineteenth century controversies over the superseding of religion.  In the early 1840s there occurred an impassioned -- and deeply symptomatic -- clash between Ludwig Feuerbach, one of the leading thinkers of the Left Hegelian movement, and Max Stirner, an obscure figure on the margins of Berlin's radical intelligentsia.  The impact of Feuerbach's The Essence of Christianity (1841) had stemmed from its pioneering of the view (adapted from Hegel) that religious consciousness is -- inherently -- an alienated form of consciousness.  Feuerbach's 'genetic-critical' method allowed him to decode the notion of a transcendent deity as an abstract projection of human capacities.  Re-appropriating these capacities, Feuerbach argued, requires us to combat the tendency of post-Cartesian thought to sever pure thinking from corporeality, reason from the life of the senses.  Our imaginary dependency on an omnipotent, immaterial -- and yet somehow objective -- being must be replaced by an acknowledgement of our finite embodiment, of human interdependency, and by the project of the collective realization of human powers.

To Stirner, however, Feuerbach's stance -- for all its proclaimed atheism -- still looked profoundly, pathetically religious.  With The Ego and his Own (better translated as 'The Unique One and his Property'), which appeared in 1844, Stirner achieved a succès de scandale, through his vehement assertion that the Left Hegelian project had not gone far enough in its effort to overcome all forms of human self-alienation.  Feuerbach remained fatally attached to the notion of an essence of humanity, of the 'human being' (der Mensch) as such; and this meant that, far from having shaken off the mind-forged manacles of religion, he had simply relocated the split between the finite and the infinite within the human.  As far as Stirner is concerned, 'Every higher being, such as truth, humanity, etc, is a being above us', and therefore a constraint on the spontaneity of the unique individual's world-appropriating will.  All such ideals divide us against themselves, perpetuating a distinction between what is fitting for human beings (and morally commendable in them), and what is to be despised and rejected.  Defiantly, Stirner refuses to make any distinction between socio-political constraints and epistemic or moral norms.  Even the notion of objective truth is no more than a final avatar of the divine:   

People do not want to give up the truth or "truth in general", but rather to search for it.  What is it except the être suprême, the highest being?   

For Stirner -- anticipating Nietzsche, and the whole troupe of his postmodern successors -- truth is made, not discovered; truths are 'human statutes and human creatures'.

The paradigmatic quality of this debate lies in its dramatization of an acute dilemma of modern thought.  Feuerbach wants to do away with religious illusion, to assert the self-sufficiency of the human.  But at the same time he retains a deep sense that what makes human existence meaningful is the experience of being opened up to something larger than ourselves.  He sets up a contrast between the hermetic character of thought, especially in its philosophical, self-referential guise, and our receptiveness to the world in sensory experience.  Awareness of the unfathomability, the boundlessness, of the natural world that surrounds and sustains us is ultimately available only through feeling.  And the supreme expression of feeling is love, in which we apprehend the effable individuality of the human other.  This is why Feuerbach can claim that 'objectively God is nothing other than the essence of feeling.' From his perspective, it is Stirner's celebration of the 'unique one', devoid of all lack, free of all dependency, which perpetuates the idea of a God, by transposing the divine attributes onto the 'I'.  But Stirner responds that there can be no source of power and authority beyond the 'I' and its willing.  Even to apply a concept to the 'I', or to include it within some more general category of the human, would be to subjugate it.

Characterized in strategic terms, Badiou's thought can be seen as an attempt to avoid these alternatives.  His atheism is as militant as Stirner's -- 'Dieu, c'est fini.  Et la religion aussi, c'est fini.' (Court traité d'ontologie transitoire, Seuil, 1998, p. 12) -- and the objective world in which he locates human beings is the infinite universe of modern physical science, lacking any inherent meaning or value.  All we can say ontologically about the world, Badiou contends, is that it consists of multiplicities of multiplicities, which can themselves be further decomposed, without end.  The only process which endows any structure on this world is the process which Badiou calls 'counting-as-one', or -- in more explicitly mathematical terms -- the treatment of elements of whatever kind, and however disparate, as belonging to a set.  We must not imagine, prior to this counting, any ultimate ground of reality.  There is no metaphysical 'One', no all-embracing 'Whole', which includes all things, and hence a fortiori no monotheistic God -- but only the not-yet-counted, or what Badiou calls 'inconsistency' or the 'pure multiple' (p. 52). This inconsistency can also be understood as the 'void' (p. 56), or the empty set that haunts every other set, since it is the only set whose existence must be presupposed, in order to generate the natural number series.

Badiou, however, is repelled by the thought that the individual's pursuit of his fluctuating desires is the only appropriate response to such a world.  Stirner, we could say, is a precursor of all those supposedly subversive postmodernists who in fact reflect the vacant, consumerist culture of contemporary capitalism.  And it is this culture, complemented by the 'fetishism of universal suffrage' (p. 350), which Badiou takes to be the dismal truth about the West.  At the same time, he is equally insistent that philosophies which emphasize our situatedness, the fragility of our thinking, and our unsurpassable being-towards-death, cannot help but conjure up meaning in a nostalgic manner, since human finitude, so understood, necessarily stands in relation to a crypto-divine infinite.  Feuerbach's thought, with its evocation of a natural world on which human beings are dependent, and which surrounds them too intimately ever to be objectified, offers an early example of the genre.  But, of course, similar structures can be found in the pre-eminent philosophical oeuvre of the twentieth century, that of Heidegger.  Indeed, the two paradigms against which Badiou measures himself  (his equivalents for Feuerbach and Stirner, we could say) are -- on the one hand -- Heidegger's thinking of finitude, and -- on the other -- the scientific naturalism of mainstream analytical philosophy, with its unavowed subjective correlate, an unbridled instrumental attitude to the world (p. 2).  Badiou agrees with Heidegger that the proper concern of philosophy is the ontological question.  Yet his founding -- deeply anti-Heideggerian -- claim is that mathematics gives us our only access to being as such, indeed that mathematics is ontology.  We live, irrevocably, in the world of the modern sciences, where nature is number: there will be no re-enchantment.

Being and Event consists of thirty-seven interlaced 'meditations', some more mathematical, some more philosophical, and some interpretations of major figures in the canon of Western thought.  Through these discussions, Badiou develops his conception of a dimension of existence which escapes the purview of constructive knowledge, or 'the encyclopedia' as he calls it, and which can perhaps best be regarded as the dimension of revelation or the donation of meaning.  It is here that he locates what he calls the 'event'.  Fidelity to an event (or rather, fidelity as the process through which an event is recognized and sustained) is what constitutes us as 'subjects': as more than merely natural beings intent on satisfying our needs and reproducing our kind.  Badiou is not the only French philosopher of recent times to have set the notion of fidelity at the heart of his thinking, as we shall find.  But what makes Badiou's work unusual, given these preoccupations, is the crucial role which he allots to mathematics, both in specifying his complex general ontology, and in providing the basic modelling of human situations.  Badiou's whole philosophy, we could say, is generated by the tension between his basic claim that mathematics is ontology, and his equally fundamental claim that, as he puts it, 'ontology is a situation' (p. 25).  For this means that, although ontology exhausts what there is, it cannot capture everything which occurs: there can be other situations, regardless of how difficult it may be to portray them theoretically.  So despite his hostility to the 'anti-philosophical' tradition in post-Hegelian thought, Badiou himself plays his own version of that tradition's typical game.  What cannot be known is what it is most urgent to know, what really matters, politically and existentially.  Badiou -- and here he differs from his post-structuralist contemporaries -- is inclined to call it 'truth'.

Ever since the Greeks, then, mathematics has given us our knowledge of being as being.  But Badiou also maintains that a decisive breakthrough was made in the latter part of the nineteenth century, with Cantor's creation of a method for handling infinite sets.  For Badiou, it is Cantor who puts the mathematical seal on the post-galilean view of the universe.  The religious conception of a finite created world dependent on an incomprehensibly infinite being is replaced by a universe in which the infinite has become actual.  Or, as Badiou puts it: 'The ontological decision concerning infinity can then simply be phrased as: an infinite natural multiplicity exists' (p. 148).  Badiou cautions his readers, however, not to take the thought of a natural infinite multiplicity as referring to a single, unified nature, a 'cosmological one' which would still be an after-image of the divine one-infinity.  Set-theoretical ontology does not deal in wholes and parts.  Furthermore, it tells us nothing about the elements which belong to a set (a set is not the same as a class, defined as the extension of a concept), and hence nothing about the qualities of the experienced world, about its 'manifest image'.  Indeed, it would not be unfair to describe Badiou's ontology as a kind of Democritean atomism -- but an atomism without atoms, or at least in which the atoms are ultimately indistinguishable from the void (p. 58).

How, then, can such a universe accommodate what Badiou calls 'the event'?  Strictly speaking, of course, it cannot do so.  The event has no objective existence; since it exhibits a distinctively reflexive structure, it only occurs through what Badiou calls an 'interpretative intervention' (p. 181).  In other words, the event emerges along with the subject who recognizes it, or who nominates it as an event.  But if we ask what precisely in the situation is being nominated, or what constitutes what Badiou calls the 'evental site', we seem to be left only with the multiplicity of elements along with which the event emerged.  In his mathematical notation, Badiou therefore writes the event as: ex = {x ∈ X, ex}.  The event consists of all the elements belonging to the evental site, X, plus the event itself.  So the 'French Revolution', to give one of Badiou's favoured examples, is more than the innumerable list of happenings that occurred in France between 1789 and 1794.  It is rather something bound up in this assemblage, which the term 'French Revolution' specifically names.  But when we try to specify what this extra something is, we find ourselves again confronted only with the assemblage of happenings -- plus that elusive addendum.  The Revolution is not simply the narrative of what occurred, but it cannot be filtered out from this narrative either.

According to Badiou, the event calls for fidelity, by which he understands the discrimination and sustaining of the consequences of the event.  Badiou emphasizes that there is no fidelity in general -- there is only fidelity to specific event, a commitment to the truth that has been disclosed.  This conception of fidelity then gives Badiou the basis he requires for his account of what it means to be a 'subject'.  Badiou breaks with any notion of the subject as transcendental condition of experience.  (We might say that, in Being and Event, the place of such a subject is taken by the anonymous process of 'counting as one'.)  Subjectivity only emerges as what he calls 'the junction of an intervention and a rule of faithful connection' (p. 239).  And for Badiou, events which call forth such a subject can occur only in four domains: in the sphere of (decidedly heterosexual) love, in science, in art, and in militant politics.

In what follows, I shall investigate two problematic aspects of Badiou's enterprise.  The first concerns the scope of his conception of the event, and the way in which his formal definition is connected with specific historical events; the second concerns his conception of fidelity.

In one sense, Badiou's philosophy, for all its mathematical bravura, sets up a quite traditional distinction between nature and history.  The historical domain is the domain of reflexivity, of a self-relatedness that does not merely register, but is constitutive of what occurs.  This is the case because, in the historical domain, the multiples that are 're-presented' at the level of what Badiou calls the 'state of the situation' can be 'abnormal', in the sense that not all the elements presented are 'represented'.  Unlike the laws of nature, social conventions are always being transgressed.  An event, Badiou then goes on to argue, is a multiplicity which is 'totally abnormal': none of its elements is represented in the 'state of the situation'.  This means that such a multiple (an 'evental site') is 'on the edge of the void' -- it is as if it did not exist.  It can only be activated, as it were, by an innovative act of naming, which launches a process of fidelity to the event that it invokes.

But, given the way in which Badiou defines the event, one might argue that 'events' are far more pervasive than Badiou allows: indeed, that they are the very texture of the socio-historical world, of the domain which Hegel -- for example -- terms 'Geist'.  To see this, we might consider the close analogy between Badiou's characterization of the event, and the way in which the later Wittgenstein describes processes that have often been ascribed to a distinctively 'mental' domain.  Expecting someone's arrival, for example, can consist of a wide range of different thoughts and activities.  There is no determinate set of thoughts and activities that can be said to be necessary and sufficient conditions of such expectation (and furthermore, activities which, in one context, are correctly taken as indicating expectation, may no longer have this meaning when transposed into a different context).  It seems, then, that we could say, applying Badiou's terminology, that the 'event' of expecting someone's arrival consists of the 'evental site' (an indeterminate range of thought and activity) -- plus the event itself (ex = {x ∈ X, ex}).  For Wittgenstein, we cannot identify the event either with specific mental processes (Cartesianism), or with specific outward actions (behaviourism), or indeed with a combination of both (generalized objectivism).  Yet, at the same time, we cannot say that the event is something other than these actions and processes either.  At one point in Zettel Wittgenstein imagines the following dialogue:

Even where the feeling that arouses joy is localized, joy is not: if for example we rejoice in the smell of a flower.  -- Joy is manifested in facial expression, in behaviour.  (But we do not say that we are joyful in our faces.)

"But I do have a real feeling of joy!"  Yes, when you are glad you really are glad.  And of course joy is not joyful behaviour, nor yet a feeling round the corners of the mouth and the eyes.

"But joy surely designates an inward thing."  No.  "Joy" designates nothing at all.  Neither any inward nor any outward thing.  (§§ 486-87)

Like joy, the Badiouian event cannot be designated -- and can be located neither in mental nor in physical space.  Indeed, we must surely conclude that joy is an event.

But once we have accepted that 'events' make up the very texture of the human world, then a question which Being and Event (along with many other of Badiou's writings) repeatedly provokes acquires even more force: how do specific happenings in the socio-historical world come to be nominated as events in his privileged sense?  Badiou tends to draw his examples from a rather conventional repertoire of scientific, aesthetic and political innovations: the French, Russian and Chinese Revolutions, Mallarmé's poetry, Schoenberg's serialism, the cubism of Braque and Picasso -- and of course Cantor's mathematics.  Not only is this very much the world viewed from the rive gauche.  In many of these cases one can contest the implication that the event concerned is an unequivocal, irreversible advance, a breakthrough that calls for the unconditional fidelity of its inheritors.

Take, for example, Schoenberg's rejection of the tonal organization of music, and his introduction of the twelve-tone row as the fundamental structuring principle.  With the entire history of twentieth-century music now behind us, it is far from clear that Schoenberg's innovations rendered tonal composition hopelessly regressive.  On the contrary, serialism -- though it produced a cluster of masterpieces -- quickly revealed its limits as a principle of organization, in the immediate post-war period.  Arguably, the mainstream of great twentieth century music continued to exploit the resources of the tonal system in new ways, while stepping back from the overriding imperative of tonal resolution.  Badiou's focus on Schoenberg seems to imply that some of the greatest achievements of twentieth century music, for example the string quartets of Bartok and Shostakovitch, have somehow betrayed the event of the 'destruction of the tonal system'.  But after all, Schoenberg himself declared that there was still good music to be written in the key of C major.

The more general issue raised by this example concerns the way in which the significance of events is constantly changing, as the historical vantage point from which they are viewed itself keeps shifting.  At the limit, this may result in what once appeared as a decisive event (Swinburne's poetry, for example) entirely losing this status.  Badiou's own intuitions about this issue seem to pull him in two different directions.  On the one hand he criticizes the notion of 'absolute novelty', especially in the context of apocalyptic fantasies of revolution: 'the event itself only exists insofar as it is submitted, by an intervention whose possibility requires recurrence -- and thus non-commencement -- to the ruled structure of the situation; as such, any novelty is relative, being legible solely after the fact as the hazard of an order' (p. 210).  But, at the same time, Badiou tries to exclude the possibility that such relativity might enable a hermeneutic downgrading of the event.  He does so by arguing that the event is the disclosure of a 'truth' -- and not just of a mutable, revisable significance.  Yet truth, on Badiou's account, cannot be demonstrated.  It 'makes a hole in a knowledge' of the ontological domain (p. 327).  It is available only to the faithful.

For Badiou, fidelity to the event is more important than the event itself.  Without fidelity, we could say, the human being would lack all consistency, would become the fragmented postmodern self of arbitrary impulse and evanescent desire.  Through fidelity we become subjects, because we pledge ourselves to sustain a continuity of thought and action -- we stand guarantor of our own future self, even though we cannot anticipate what pressures and contingencies this future will bring.  As Badiou puts it, hyperbolically, in a short tract subsequent to Being and Event, it is through fidelity that I rise above my existence as a 'human animal' and become 'the Immortal that I am capable of being' (Ethics, Verso, 2001, pp. 46, 49).

It is tempting to compare Badiou's thought in this regard with the arguments of that other great philosopher of fidelity in the modern French tradition -- the Catholic existentialist Gabriel Marcel (who, like Badiou, was also a playwright).  Both thinkers, we could say, hold the deep conviction that human existence is only meaningful if one 'makes oneself over, gives oneself' as Marcel puts it.  But for Marcel, fidelity to the non-human can easily become perverted: 'Fidelity to a principle as a principle is idolatry in the etymological sense of the word; it might be my sacred duty for me to deny a principle from which life has withdrawn and which I know I no longer accept, for by continuing to conform my actions to it, it is myself -- myself as presence -- that I betray.'  Marcel is more sympathetic to the notion of fidelity in the domain of aesthetic activity, precisely because of the element of creativity that is involved.  But it is in relation to the other person, the 'thou', that fidelity truly finds its home.  The reason for this, it seems, is that we could not say that any person is intrinsically undeserving of fidelity, or that his or her meriting of fidelity is in any way dependent on my attitude, whereas in the case of aesthetic, political or even scientific insight there remains an element of subjective evaluation.

But here an important feature of Marcel's argument becomes relevant.  Fidelity requires an undertaking with respect to the comportment of our future self.  But, firstly, how is it possible for me to make such a pledge, to guarantee that my behaviour will be proof against contingencies?  And secondly, even if I could do this, what would be the point of my doing so, if my inner feelings had changed?  For fidelity, Marcel emphasizes, is not simply a matter of doing one's duty -- indeed, the recipient of dutiful concern may experience this as the very opposite of fidelity.  Given that we may discover that we have been faithful to a false image of another person, or that this other may change his character for the worse, we might begin to think that the very notion of fidelity has something counterproductive, self-defeating about it.  Marcel, however, draws the opposite conclusion: that fidelity 'aspires to unconditionality', as he puts it.  The point of fidelity, we could say, and -- according to Marcel ­­-- even its possibility, 'depends on that absolute fidelity which we may now call simply faith.'  For Marcel, 'A code of ethics centred on fidelity is irresistibly led to become attached to what is more than human, to a desire for the unconditional which is the requirement and the very mark of the Absolute in us'.

We have already explored some of the problems raised by Badiou's highly selective designation of certain happenings in the historical and cultural world as 'events'.  But in the light of Marcel's discussion, we can also pose questions about Badiou's identification of certain practices as faithful sequences.  For Marcel, 'It is not our part to judge what constitutes treason or fidelity in another.'  Indeed, we cannot do so, since fidelity can only be appreciated by the person to whom it is pledged, and has 'an essential element of spontaneity, itself radically independent of the will.'  By contrast, Badiou believes himself entitled to declare, for example, what constitutes fidelity in the domain of politics.  'True (rare) politics' (p. 17) is politics in the revolutionary tradition -- even after the decline of (and, indeed Badiou's own critique of) the Marxist conception of revolution.  It is the militant practice of an inspired vanguard.  Everything else Badiou dismisses as mere administration, the bureaucratic management of society.  But there is no reason to accept such a narrow definition of politics -- rather than regarding politics as the struggle and negotiation between social groups over the power to shape the society to which they belong.  Often it seems that it is the experience of exaltation offered by 'militant organized activity' (p. 341) which Badiou prizes over any determinate political goal.  And when he endorses the slogan, 'let's be faithful to the event that we are' (p. 236), the threat of collective solipsism inherent in his conception becomes apparent.

As we saw at the beginning of this review, it is not easy -- even for proclaimed philosophical atheists ­-- to avoid recycling religious and theological tropes in their very effort to break with the past.  But Badiou goes one step further than this, since his philosophy plays deliberately and provocatively with religious language (not just the language of fidelity, but of 'conversion', and even of 'grace').  Some of his most admired militants of the event belong to the religious sphere, such as Pascal and Saint Paul.  And on some occasions, in Being and Event, he admits the possibility of religious truth (e.g., p. 399) -- even though this disrupts his own categorization of truths.  The problem is that Badiou's transposition of the notion of fidelity from the sphere of love (to which he concedes that it directly refers (p. 232)), the misdirection of his passion for the unconditional towards happenings in the mutable socio-historical world, brings with it the dangers of dogmatism and exclusivism, if not worse.  And it also raises one final issue.  Badiou repeatedly declares that God 'does not exist' (e.g., p. 277).  But the whole of Being and Event is an intense and intricate exploration of what does not exist -- namely the event, for which there is 'no acceptable ontological matrix' (p. 190).  Furthermore, Badiou's own thinking cannot help but lead towards the question: why ought we to become subjects, why should we commit ourselves to a life of fidelity?  Indeed, Badiou himself later poses this question in terms of the 'fidelity to fidelity that defines ethical consistency' (Ethics, pp. 49-50).  And although this may not be Badiou's answer, it is not clear what aspect of his system would rule it out as a response: because we are called by God, who is the event of events.