Richard Kearney

The God Who May Be: A Hermeneutics of Religion

Kearney, Richard, The God Who May Be: A Hermeneutics of Religion, Indiana University Press, 2001, 192 pp, $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-253-21489-0

Reviewed by Frances Gray, University of New England (Australia)

There can be fragile and unstable boundaries between religion, theology and philosophy. Richard Kearney’s The God Who May Be: A Hermeneutics of Religion (a title reminiscent of Levinas’ Of God Who Comes to Mind) is an erudite and clever adventure across these boundaries, an adventure which suggests that drawing boundaries might be a thankless, if not pointless, task at times. For example, the term, ‘deconstructive-eschatology’ and its cognates (p.106) is clearly transgressive: it involves a rejection of onto-theology, of (some forms of) eschatology and of atheistic deconstruction (Derrida); and it embraces, happily and successfully, some of the now collapsing boundaries once so dogmatically held by some philosophers (and perhaps which still are. Indeed they may even be exempt from the qualifier “now collapsing”).

The primary focus of Kearney’s text is an exploration of the notion of a possible God, not the God of process theology, but a God derivative of post-structural philosophy and hermeneutic philosophical theology: ‘God neither is or is not but may be… God, who is traditionally thought of as act or actuality might be rethought as possibility.” (p.1) The possible God, The God Who May Be, emerges through Kearney’s deft tracings of the biblical, theological and philosophical inspirations that illuminate his text. Indeed Kearney’s possible God is as much a construction of spirituality and theology as it is of philosophical traditions and twentieth century European/continental philosophies.

His reading of Ricoeur, Levinas and Derrida, masters of paradox that they are, should be seen as the cartographic underpinning of this difficult adventure. From his novel, eschatological reading of persona, to a conception of a ludic God who will, with human assistance, bring about the Kingdom, we see Kearney as a man enmired in chewing-gum logos, and feeling his way through what seems like the irresistible pull of his religious faith. And that Kearney is a man writing this text is a bit of a sticking point, for me as a woman philosopher, a woman reader of this book. But I shall return to that issue shortly.

Ricoeur and Levinas figure prominently in Kearney’s intriguing explication of persona as eschaton, an irreducible other (“I stress, as eschaton, not as telos (i.e., a fulfillable, predictable, foreseeable goal) …” (p.12) Initially, the eschatological persona acts as a kind of trope for the embodiment of absence/presence: here, in this human being before me, a human being who is a marker of alterity, an other, I see someone, but I never quite see that someone. S/he is always simultaneously absent and present; s/he always exceeds what I behold (pace Ricoeur). And this other is always an irreducible other (pace Levinas) over whom one has no power. The being before me is flesh and blood, argues Kearney, but is not solely reducible to or describable in terms of, flesh and blood. The otherness of the human is contained by her/his body, yet is not so contained. There and not there, here and not here, absence in presence, I meet the other, face to face. And this adds another dimension to my experience of alterity: the face of the other (prosopon) announces the ethical situatedness of the relation I find myself in with her/him. There is, then, a beyond always, a repetition of Levinasian infinite in the finite, an echo of Descartes and of Aquinas.

The spatial metaphor is accompanied by an equally compelling temporal metaphor: “(t)he persona is always already there and always still to come.” (p.12) The always still to come signals the chronos/kairos nuance implicit in possibility and which is then carried forward to Kearney’s exegesis of the God Who May Be. The Kingdom is of the future, something that is envisaged, eschatological, a promise. The possible human, to borrow a phrase from Jean Houston, and the possible God are necessary correlates of each other.

Kearney develops these themes through a sometimes imaginatively light-hearted but profoundly astute exposition of biblical and philosophical texts. (“So there we have it. Holy Moses, a tired shepherd with a price on his head, dusty and parched after days of wandering about with his father-in-law’s sheep in the desert, is confronted with an angel who eludes him, a fire that won’t burn out, and a voice that answers his question with a riddle …”). (p.21) His reading of Moses’ experience with the burning bush, Moses’ meeting with the transfiguring Yahweh God who announces “I am he who is” and which Kearney then re-reads as “I am who I may be” traces connections between persona/prosopon and its implications of excess, and a notion of transfiguration through the activity of the possible God who is also simultaneously absent and present, for ever in excess of Godself.

What Kearney stresses in the role of human being in the possibilizing of God is reminiscent of the Catholic doctrine of co-operation with the divine to bring about God’s Kingdom of justice and peace here on earth. Yet Kearney moves beyond that simple repetition of Catholic dogma to the startling claim God is powerless and that in bringing about the Kingdom we are actively involved in making God possible, hence enabling God to be, em-powering God: God needs us, as creation as much as we need Him. It seems that a sort of co-dependence is thus envisioned between God and God’s creation. (p.110) But this is where the ludic comes to the fore: a poetics of God, a poetics of the possible, inspired by Heidegger, and in which playfulness is a central theme. This poetics emphasises the assonance between being and becoming: rather than an oppositional duality, being becomes, and becoming is.

But what does the notion of a possible God amount to? Kearney’s elucidation encompasses Aristotle, Leibniz and Bergson, whom he characterizes as metaphysicians of the possible: such metaphysics conceives of the possible “as a latency or lacking matter to be realized into act.” (p.83) In this reading, the real contains the possible; the possible is not a modality outside being. This, in effect, privileges being over becoming, the real over the possible, argues Kearney. From an eschatological perspective, then, how is one to come to any new understanding of the divine on this reading? Kearney asserts that “it is just this metaphysical opposition between the divinely real and the non-divinely possible” that he wants to contest. (p.84) So that his discussion of Husserl, Bloch, Heidegger and Derrida as post-metaphysical theorists of the possible is intended to introduce alternatives to metaphysical possibility, in keeping with his own oppositional gesture. What he ends up doing is appropriating aspects of their theories which he sees as more conducive to the eschatological view he is proposing while rejecting Derrida’s radical atheism. That is significant because Kearney is so obviously deeply sympathetic to Derridean sensibilities on faith and eschatology (see pp.93 –99).

My main criticism of Kearney’s book is his persistent and problematic use of the pronouns ‘He’ for God, and ‘we’ and ‘us’. Let me deal with the latter in the first instance. Kearney’s concluding remarks in the final chapter outline a poetics of a possible God which could be read as religious proselytising. Commenting that new being, other-being “promises a new heaven and a new earth,” Kearney asks: “Is such a thing possible? Not for us alone. But it is not impossible to God – if we help God to become God. How? By opening ourselves to the ‘loving possible,’ by acting each moment to make the impossible a bit more possible.” (p.111) Who is this we/us? If Kearney is representing the whole of creation, it is exceedingly difficult to reconcile the beliefs of religious faiths and spiritualities which are other than Christian monotheism with what he proposes. It seems to me that the reader is invited, indeed encouraged, to be party to a possibility which could very easily be diametrically opposed, even offensive, to her/his fundamental religious or a-religious orientation.

A related issue is Kearney’s use of ‘He’ as the preferred (and only) pronoun for God, a use which highlights what I think of as Kearney’s sex/gender blind spot. Why is God ‘He’? What about a God Who May Be makes God a ‘He’? Is it that Kearney is unable to dissociate himself from the Hebrew Yahweh God, unable to disrupt the masculine paternal bias of the Christian tradition? Why does Kearney persevere with the privileging of a masculine Divine, indeed with the practice of sex/gendering God? Has Kearney never read any feminist (for example) critiques of the masculine paternal divine (for instance, Elisabeth Schüssler Fiorenza, Elizabeth Johnson, Luce Irigaray)?

The idea that there is no neutral theory, that theory is always already inscribed by the subjectivity of the theorist, is old enough now to have had widespread circulation. But it seems at times as though this circulation has not been quite widespread enough: Some, and perhaps Kearney is among them, simply have not “got” the message. This not only applies to the sex/gendering of God. That considerations of race, class, sex/gender, ethnicity et al render use of the terms ‘we’ and ‘us’ incredibly tricky, to say the least, is unnoticed in Kearney’s book. Kearney’s chapter, “Desiring God”, for example, while in praise of the Levinasian trinity, “voluptuosity-fecundity-paternity” does not take account of the clearly masculinist bias of Levinas’ theory; nor for that matter, does it take account of any feminist philosophical theological critical reading of Levinas (for example, those by Luce Irigaray, Grace Jantzen, or Morny Joy). In short, it seems to me that it is tritely true that women read, indeed are required to read men but that (most) men do not seem to read (most) women. And given the subject matter of Kearney’s book, that seems to me to be a significant oversight.

Why is this important? The questions of love and justice that are in many ways central to Kearney’s book are not simply the domain of men. As one of my women colleagues in sociology once remarked, Derrida’s notion of hospitality erases the pregnant woman’s body, surely an originary site of hospitality and perhaps a primal site of the pure gift. Representation is thus crucial, it seems to me, in a hermeneutics which so boldly speaks on behalf of ‘us’, in which ‘we’ are meant to find ourselves.

In the end, I am agnostic about Kearney’s theo-spiritual commitments and the we-ness of his message. Perhaps I would side with Derrida and ask, “Why God, of any kind/description at all, anyway?” Nonetheless the book is eminently readable and theoretically challenging. I am pleased to have read it.