2002.03.11

Colin McGinn

Logical Properties

McGinn, Colin, Logical Properties, Oxford University Press, 2001, 128 pp, $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 0-19-924181-3.

Reviewed by Patricia Blanchette, University of Notre Dame


This nice little book comprises five chapters, each of which deals with a central logical “property.” These are, in order: identity, existence, predication, necessity, and truth. Some chapters are considerably more controversial than others; all are engaging and worthwhile. Though a certain amount of thematic development takes place across the chapters, they are largely independent of one another, and can profitably be read in isolation.

Chapter I spells out and argues for a straightforward, old-fashioned and sensible view of identity. Its four central claims are as follows:

  1. That identity is unitary, which is to say that it doesn’t come in various kinds. The discussion here is directed against the views e.g. that identity is to be divided into numerical vs. qualitative, that identities are all sortal-relative, and so on.
  2. That identity is indefinable. Here there are three arguments, all directed against the claim that we can define identity by setting “x=y” equivalent to “for all P, Px iff Py.” - First is the familiar argument, that if identity-invoking properties (‘identical-with-x’) are allowed in the range of P, then the definition is circular, while if not, then it will presumably declare distinct objects identical. - Second is a circularity objection, namely that the definition presupposes the notion of property identity. - Third is another circularity objection, that the definition (any definition) presupposes the notion of concept-identity, since its upshot is that the concepts in question (expressed by definiens and definiendum) are identical.
  3. That identity is fundamental, which is to say, at least, that it is universal (everything is self-identical), and that either it or its fundamental law (just noted in parentheses) are presupposed in such simple notions as that of predication and in the basic logical laws.
  4. That identity is a genuine relation.

On the whole, this chapter is notable more for its sensible approach than for its novelty: it is hard to argue with the claim that identity is as simple and fundamental as McGinn takes it to be, particularly when the position is laid out as clearly as this. One part of this chapter readers may take issue with concerns the circularity-arguments in defense of claim (ii).

The first circularity argument is that “for all P, Px iff Py” is a way of saying “x and y have the same properties,” and hence invokes the notion of identity. One might object that despite the heuristic value of the restatement, what’s really intended is just “for all P, Px iff Py,” in which identity makes no appearance. Does the recurrence of “P” in this statement indicate an implicit reliance on the “notion” of property-identity? The answer is not trivial; certainly it is worth pointing out that no criterion of property-identity seems required for the understanding or application of the schema. If we imagine it settled what the extension of each property is, while leaving it open whether some of those properties are really identical or simply co-extensive (or while rejecting the notion of property-identity altogether), then it is in fact settled, for any objects x and y, whether x has all the properties y has and vice-versa. If, as is arguably the case, the relation of property-coextensiveness itself turns on a prior notion of object-identity, then this way of avoiding the circle will in the end prove unsatisfactory; but this would seem to call for further discussion.

The second circularity-objection seems also less than convincing. If we agree that definitions assert some kind of identity (of concepts, of meanings, etc.), then this objection gets off the ground; otherwise, not. So for those who think that something like synonymy is not to be analyzed in terms of the identity of some abstract object, it looks like the second circularity-objection will fail to be convincing.

This is not to say, of course, that there is a coherent way to disagree with the conclusion of these arguments. The good old-fashioned argument McGinn gives at the outset is arguably entirely sufficient.

Chapter 2 is the longest, and will be viewed by many readers as the most controversial, chapter. Its topic is the nature of existence, specifically the question whether existence is a (non-trivial) property. McGinn’s answer is “yes.” Not everything exists, on this view, and the realm of the nonexistent is rather vast, including some unusual entities that even fans of e.g. fictional objects might not have taken themselves to be committed to.

The question whether existence is a property can be seen as the question whether

(i) F’s exist

simply means

(ii) There are F’s.

Those taking existence to be a property deny the semantic equivalence, holding that (i) makes a stronger statement than does (ii), a statement to the effect that, of the F’s, some have the property of existence. That existence is a non-trivial property amounts to the view that some substitutions for F will render (i) and (ii) false and true, respectively. To deny that existence is a property, on the other hand, is essentially to hold that (i) and (ii) make the same claim.

The primary attraction of holding that existence is a property comes from the smooth treatment allowed on this view of such statements as

(iii) Mary exists; and
(iv) Holmes does not exist.

Holding that existence is a property allows one to hold that (iv) wears its logical structure on its sleeve: that it, just like “Plantinga doesn’t smoke,” is true because the individual referred to via its singular term lacks the property he is said to lack. Those who deny that existence is a property must deny the semantic parallel: there is no individual, on this view, for (iv)’s singular term to refer to. The latter view involves an alternative account of the significance of (iv): rather than picking out an individual and denying a property of it, on this view, (iv) must be understood along the lines of a denial of (i) or (ii), as saying of some appropriate F that it has no instances.

McGinn’s primary reasons for regarding existence as a property stem from dissatisfaction with the alternative just sketched, and particularly involve the following four complaints:

  1. That the alternative (aka “the traditional view”) is circular, since “has instances” must mean “has existent instances.”
  2. That it can make no sense of the notion of property-existence.
  3. That there are sentences that resist the traditional paraphrase. E.g. “something exists.”
  4. That the traditional view requires, implausibly, that every thing that exists has some (further) property.

All four complaints will have to be taken seriously by the proponent of the traditional view. There is unfortunately insufficient space here for a discussion of each of them, but the first calls for a couple of quick comments. To begin with, the circularity-complaint would seem to beg the question, since for the traditionalist, because there are no non-existent things, and “existent” is not a meaningful predicate, “has instances” does not after all mean “has existent instances.” Secondly, it’s not clear that McGinn is in any position to maintain that “has instances” really means “has existent instances,” in light of his view that we can truly say that there are many things that don’t exist. Presumably, on McGinn’s view, the truth of

(v) There are fictional objects

implies that the concept fictional object has instances, but of course not that it has existent instances.

The crucial question, in the end, will be whether the difficulties to be dealt with by the traditional view prove more or less tractable than those facing McGinn’s positive proposal. As McGinn himself notes (p. 37), an important potential pitfall of accounts on which “exists” is a non-trivial predicate is the implication that the non-existent entities do after all exist, but in some second-class way. In order to avoid this Meinongian difficulty, McGinn emphasizes the mind-dependence of the non-existent things he countenances. They are all purely intentional: “As it were, thought and language are what bring non-existent objects into being” (38n). This account certainly avoids some of the extravagance of Meinong’s universe. But it’s not clear that it avoids what McGinn has set out to avoid, namely a realm of second-class existence, just known by another predicate: instead of Meinong’s subsistence, we have McGinn’s being.

Possibilia pose, as McGinn also recognizes, a potential difficulty for the account of non-existent things as mind-dependent. For one might well hold that merely possible objects fail to exist (and hence should count on this ontology as non-existent objects), and yet they are arguably not all mind-dependent (since possibility need not imply conceivability, and ought certainly not to imply conceived). McGinn’s response here is that metaphysically possible objects (e.g. the younger sister I might have had) do exist, just not actually. They do so, incidentally, independently of our cognitive activity. (Sherlock Holmes and unicorns, on the other hand, are taken by McGinn not to be genuinely possible, and so to rest, as desired, with the nonexistent.)

Impossible objects, too, require this treatment in order not to count as counterexamples to the thesis that all non-existent objects are thought of. So impossible objects, on McGinn’s view, do exist, just not actually. Round squares exist.

We seem now to have not just a single kind of second-class way of being, but in fact two such second-class kinds: In addition to the first-class objects that actually exist, we have those that exist but are not actual (my possible younger sister, the round square in my desk drawer), and those that simply are but don’t exist (Sherlock Holmes, griffins). At this point, not only might the stratified and abundant universe begin to seem a high price to pay for the smooth semantics of singular existence-statements, but the account also seems in danger of maintaining a “naïve” semantics of singular existence-statements at the cost of rejecting such a naïve semantics elsewhere. The sentence

(vi) Round squares don’t exist

can only be taken to express the obviously true claim it is (sometimes) intended to express if it is read as elliptical for

(vii) Round squares don’t actually exist.

Perhaps more problematic is that we are given no account of what it is for a thing to “actually exist.”

A pervasive theme in dissatisfaction with traditional accounts of apparently singular existence-statements, both in this book and elsewhere, is that these accounts’ reliance on an “appropriate F” associated with e.g. proper names is implausible. The reasons here are essentially the same as those which underlie dissatisfaction with traditional “descriptivist” accounts of the semantics of proper names. In this regard, it is worth noting a certain parallel between traditionalist and McGinn-style treatments of such statements, and particularly of their negations. For both the traditionalist and the anti-traditionalist of McGinn’s stripe, the truth of apparently singular statements of the form “a doesn’t exist” turns essentially on our conceptual activity, on our ways of characterizing the (purported) entities in question. For the traditionalist, this is because “a doesn’t exist” means “~ExFx”1 for some appropriate F. For McGinn, this is because the referent of the singular term a “comes into being” as a result of our conceptual activity. A lingering question for those pursuing McGinn’s strategy is whether the concepts operative in bringing into being the nonexistent objects would themselves suffice as the much maligned instances of F. In any case, the essentially conceptual route to reference to non-existent objects may well give us reason to rethink the claimed semantic parallels that drive a commitment to nonexistent objects.

Chapter 3 is concerned to defend the view that predicates refer to properties, in opposition to what McGinn calls the “standard” view, that the semantic role of predicates is best viewed in terms of their extensions. McGinn cogently points out that the standard view cannot be motivated either by the claim that it preserves an important parallel between the semantics of singular terms and that of predicates (since the semantics of singular terms could equivalently be given in terms of properties, if one so desired), or by its relation to a Tarskian semantics (which is neutral on the issue). A brief excursion into metaphysics helps support the view that McGinn’s is the “natural” conception of the semantics of predicates, taking it for granted that there are such things as properties.

The lingering difficulty in this chapter is that it is unclear exactly what view is really being disagreed with. McGinn claims to be arguing against Quine, but in order to seriously take on Quine’s preference for property-less semantics, one would have to engage Quine’s arguments against the existence of properties. Once one has taken properties for granted, the serious reasons for purely extensional semantics would seem to have been largely sidestepped.

Chapter 4 concerns the analysis of necessity and possibility. Its negative part argues that modal terms cannot helpfully be explained in terms of quantification over possible worlds, since the appeal to possibility in invoking those worlds makes the explanation circular. This is certainly a point worth keeping in mind; any attempt both to give an informative analysis of modality in terms of possible worlds and to refrain from further explanation of this adjectival “possible” is bound to fail. Whether talk of possible worlds typically fits this mold is, however, far from clear. Here it will be important to ask e.g. whether a claimed equivalence between ordinary modal statements and their possible-worlds analogues can be illuminating even if not reductive, and whether some ordinary explanations of possible worlds (in terms e.g. of consistency) can reasonably be regarded as reductive.

The positive part of Chapter 4 argues that modal statements are to be understood in a “copula-modifier” way: to say that Socrates is necessarily human is to say that he has the ordinary property of humanity, and further that he has it necessarily. The advantages of this over a standard “predicate-modifier” account (on which the statement says that Socrates has the property of necessary humanity) are clearly argued. A brief metaphysical excursion includes the claim that modal facts supervene on the non-modal, that they are epiphenomenal, and that they are ineliminable.

Chapter 5 concerns truth. McGinn sets out here to defend a view he calls “thick disquotationalism,” something which is intended to have the virtues of disquotationalism without being deflationist about truth. There is much to think about in this chapter, and it will repay some careful attention. But McGinn’s position itself is less than clear in these pages.

Disquotationalism is standardly thought of as the view that the meaning of the truth-predicate is to be explained in terms of the truth of the disquotation-biconditionals, those sentences of the form

“Snow is white” is true iff snow is white,

or their propositional counterparts,

The proposition that snow is white is true iff snow is white.

The view is deflationist if it implies that to assert that a proposition is true is simply to assert that proposition, so that truth is in some sense not a “real” property. On McGinn’s view, though truth is to be defined in terms of (the left-to-right half of) the biconditionals, it nevertheless remains a real property of propositions.

As to the difference between the left and right halves of the biconditional: McGinn takes it (a) that the left half is logically stronger than the right, in virtue of its commitment to the existence of a proposition; and (b) that the entailment from right to left fails in cases of truth-value gaps. As to (b), we can, says McGinn, “affirm that Holmes is a detective without having to be committed to the claim that this proposition is true” (94). Why one might want to affirm such a thing (or to take such an affirmation to be coherent) is not altogether clear; one might have thought it obvious that if Holmes is a detective, then it is true that Holmes is a detective. In general, whether one agrees that truth-value gaps provide counterexamples to the propositional versions of the biconditionals will turn on whether one takes those gaps to occur for propositions, or merely to occur at the level of sentences.

McGinn’s definition of truth takes two forms. The first turns on the notion of a “self-effacing” property, by which is meant one whose application-conditions can be stated without making reference to that very property. That truth is self-effacing can be seen as follows: when we say that “snow is white” is true iff (only if?) snow is white, we have spoken on the right-hand side only about snow and about whiteness, and not about truth, but have managed nonetheless to say under what conditions the proposition in question is true. Truth, at last, is defined as the only self-effacing property.

The second form of the truth-definition is as follows: “Truth is to be defined as that property of a proposition that entails the fact (purportedly) stated by the proposition”(104).

The two definitions are rather different. The first one, oddly, turns on the claim, as McGinn notes, that the right-hand side of the disquotation-biconditionals gives necessary and sufficient conditions for the truth of the proposition embedded in its left-hand side. But this is difficult to square with McGinn’s earlier claims that the left-hand side is logically stronger than the right, and that the right-to-left entailment has counterexamples, each of which implies that the conditions are not after all sufficient. Perhaps the spirit of the definition is to be captured by focusing on the claim that the right-hand side gives merely necessary conditions for the left. In this case, truth can be taken to be a “self-effacing” property only if this means that a necessary condition for its application can be given without appeal to that property. But read this way, the claim that truth is uniquely self-effacing becomes implausible.

The second definition is more in keeping with McGinn’s stated emphasis on the left-to-right half of the biconditionals. The talk of properties entailing facts is presumably shorthand for the idea that a proposition’s having that property entails the fact in question: That the proposition snow is white has the property entails that snow is white. That truth has this characteristic is clear. But that it is the only property with this characteristic is less so. The properties being provable in PA, being believed by God, being true iff 2+2=4, being known by Smith, etc., all have the characteristic. McGinn counters this observation by pointing out that these properties all, in some sense, embed the notion of truth. This is perhaps true, but not obviously helpful here: the fact remains that we cannot hope to characterize truth as the unique possessor of the characteristic in question.

The thought behind the definition is presumably either (a) that truth is in some sense the fundamental, or minimal, property whose behavior can be so characterized, or (b) that the meaning of the truth-predicate (unlike the predicates just listed) is exhausted by its licensing of the left-to-right half of the disquotation biconditionals. But if (a), then the claim needs a good deal more explanation and defense; and if (b) then the position threatens to dissolve into a standard deflationist account.

Overall, this is a book well worth reading. Though many of the issues call for a fuller treatment, this is presumably due in large part to the attempt, well-executed, to keep the book both brief and straightforward. Partly because of the questions left open, this book will be read with profit by students newish to the field, as well as by those who have been thinking about these issues for a long time.

Endnotes

1. The 'E' in this formula should be read as the backwards 'E' of existential quantification.