2008.03.02

Tyler Burge,

Foundations of Mind: Philosophical Essays, Volume 2

Tyler Burge, Foundations of Mind: Philosophical Essays, Volume 2, Oxford University Press, 2007, 494pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199216239.

Reviewed by Mohan Matthen, University of Toronto


Saul Kripke's treatment of proper names and natural kind terms and Hilary Putnam's Twin Earth thought-experiment have had a profound influence on the theory of meaning.  These examples show that for many terms, extension is not determined by a description associated with the meaning of a term.  A descriptive term is one associated with certain general conditions -- conditions not dependent on any particular individual or occurrence -- such that it denotes whatever satisfies these conditions.  Kripke and Putnam showed that 'Aristotle', 'gold', and 'water' are not descriptive terms.

This raises the question: What about mental states that are intentionally characterized in terms of proper names or natural kind terms?  What is it to believe that water is wet, or that Aristotle wrote the Metaphysics?  Since it can be controversial which kinds of propositions are fit to be the objects of mental states, the answer to this question cannot be read directly off the Kripke-Putnam positions.  For one may ask: "Is it appropriate to ascribe to humans mental states involving non-descriptive terms as constituents?"  (When we talk about the belief that water is wet should we really be talking only about the belief that the stuff that occurs in rivers and lakes is wet?)  It is clear in light of Putnam and Kripke that if I can believe that water is wet then it cannot be by virtue of some descriptive specification of these things that I carry about in my head.  What is it then about my mental state that would make it be about water?

This issue about mental states involves reflections outside the domain of language.  In my view, the philosopher who has contributed most to its resolution is not Kripke or Putnam, but Tyler Burge.  The present volume is a collection of his essays on mind, most of them concerned with this central issue, together with an Introduction and three substantial postscripts.  Most philosophers of mind will already have read many of these papers.  It is nonetheless beneficial to trace Burge's development and distinctive contribution.

Burge calls his position "anti-individualism".  (Bad salesmanship!  One shouldn't label one's positive ideas "anti" this or that.  Moreover, it is stylistically awkward, and leads to a lot of double negatives.)  Individualism maintains that the nature of a mental state constitutively depends only on "psychological resources cognitively available" to the subject (153).  Two small notes.  First, many of Burge's specifications of individualism, including this one, are coupled with mention of the subject's physical state, but it is not entirely clear that physical states are relevant here -- see chapter 16.  (There has been some discussion by Burge himself and by others of the implications of anti-individualism for mental supervenience: I do not take this to be centrally relevant to his position.)  Second, "cognitively available" is for him connected in interesting ways with phenomenal consciousness on the one hand and self-consciousness on the other -- see chapter 18 -- but it is not necessary to take this into account to follow anti-individualism.

One approach that emerged very early on in the discussion of mental states is that, by analogy with Kripke's causal theory of non-descriptive terms, a thought might be about water at least partly because it is causally related to water in a certain way, and not entirely because of its subjectively available character.  If this is true, then assuming that it is part of the nature of a thought that it is about this individual or kind and not about another, individualism is on the wrong track.  If the contents of my mind were in all subjectively available respects the same, but failed to stand in the requisite relation to water, my thought would not have been about water.  This is the starting point for Burge's reflections.

Burge transformed the discussion about mental content in a decisive way.  First of all, he observed that the questions posed above concern de dicto just as much as de re attitudes ("Other Bodies", chapter 4, 85-91).  In Putnam's example, Adam is related to water on Earth in exactly the same way as his twin is related to XYZ on Twin Earth, and his thoughts are subjectively indistinguishable from his twin's.  Putnam takes it, correctly, that the extension of Adam's water-thoughts is water, while that of his twin's corresponding thoughts is XYZ.  However, he does not seem to notice that Adam's twin also has no de dicto belief correctly expressed in English by the words "Water is F".  For the twin's lexeme 'water' has a quite different sense than its English, i.e. on-Earth, counterpart: the latter designates water; the former XYZ.  It follows that 'water' is not indexical (though many including Putnam thought so): its extension does not (like 'here', or 'on this planet') change when you move from Earth to Twin Earth: it denotes H2O wherever you are.

Putnam misleads when he says "Cut the pie any way you like, 'meanings' just ain't in the head".[1]  He thereby suggests that it is only external reality that distinguishes Adam from his twin.  Burge shows this wrong: the sense of their thoughts is different; what's in the head is different.  Meanings are in the head, though the content that resides there is type-identified (in part) by external reality.

In "Individualism and the Mental" (chapter 5), one of the most celebrated philosophy papers of the last quarter of the twentieth century, Burge famously brought linguistic and other social conventions into the class of content-determiners.  In his "arthritis" thought experiment, Burge first envisions a man who asks his doctor whether he has arthritis in his thigh.  Told that arthritis is by definition an inflammation of the joints, the man simply "relinquishes his view" and asks what might be wrong with his thigh.  Now Burge asks: what if this same man had lived in a community where the lexeme 'arthritis' was indeed used to cover pains in the thigh (just as he had mistakenly supposed in the "actual" case)?  In the counterfactual situation, the subjectively available contents of his mind are the same as in the actual case.  Yet: "It is reasonable to suppose that in the counterfactual situation, the patient lacks some -- probably all -- of the attitudes commonly attributed with content clauses containing 'arthritis' in oblique contexts" (106).  The man in the counterfactual situation does not have a belief that is correctly expressed by the English sentence "Arthritis can occur in the thigh," but the man in the actual situation does.  The very same subjectively available mental state is an arthritis-thought in the actual case, but a "tharthritis"-thought in the counterfactual.

Thus far, the argument runs parallel to Burge's observations regarding 'water' recounted two paragraphs ago.  Notice, however, that 'arthritis' is not a natural kind term; it covers all chronic or recurrent pains in the joints, regardless of their origin and cause -- it is a purely descriptive term.  This has an important consequence.

Take a natural kind term like 'water'.  Kripke and Putnam claim that the natural unity of water plays a role in its ostensive definition.  It is defined, they suppose, by pointing to a sample and saying, "That kind of stuff": whatever is naturally of the same kind at the thing ostended automatically falls into the extension of the term, regardless of what the provider of this ostensive definition (or anybody else) might believe.  Now, suppose I want to define a term 'n-water' to mean 'water that is found in North America'.  Because 'n-water' has no natural unity, I cannot do this by simply pointing to a sample of North American water and saying "stuff like that".   Willy-nilly, such an ostensive definition would spread to some natural kind, presumably to water itself.

In Burge's example 'arthritis' is a descriptive term both in the actual case and in the counterfactual case.  In both cases, it covers an odd assortment of diseases with only symptoms in common, united by the explicit definition (which the patient in the example does not fully grasp).  There is no natural unity to bear the burden of determining meaning.  The definition of this term is in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions, whether or not a given user fully grasps these conditions.  Thus, the Kripke-Putnam argument doesn't apply.  This is where Burge steps in: he shows that what one thinks by means of 'arthritis' is also determined by something outside one's mind, i.e., by the linguistic conventions that prevail in one's community.  (This attitude towards convention, namely that it does not demand explicit awareness, is foreshadowed in a 1975 article critical of Lewis's account, reprinted as chapter 1 of the present volume.)

By contrast, then, with Kripke's and Putnam's terms, it is not the extension of the thought about arthritis that determines its meaning and the nature of the patient's thoughts, but something that the man was not even thinking about -- the linguistic conventions of his community.  The argument thus extends anti-individualism to thoughts involving descriptive terms -- to all terms, in short.  This is important, as we shall see, because it undercuts attempts to rehabilitate individualism by appealing to "narrow content" or de dicto mental states as plausible reinterpretations of content shown to be externally type-identified.  Cut the pie any way you like, there ain't no panacea for the Individualist.

For all its farsightedness, "Individualism and the Mental" has to my ear a faintly old-fashioned tone.  This is largely because the bulk of this long paper (50 pages in this printing) is devoted to arguing something that one tends to take for granted nowadays: that in the "actual" case, our patient uses 'arthritis' in the sense that English (in common with other modern languages) provides, even though his grasp of that sense is incomplete, or even mistaken.  Burge argues at great length that it is possible for concepts to be constituents of one's thoughts despite such flaws in one's understanding.  This argument was required by the dialectic of the time, when (for instance) philosophers of science were so hypnotized by the necessary and sufficient conditions model of conceptual grasp that they were inclined to think that important (or perhaps even unimportant) changes of theory implied changes of meaning.  An argument then in the air: Relativistic mass is defined differently from Classical mass; so the Theory of Relativity does not formally contradict Classical Mechanics.  Feyerabend (and others) concluded that theory choice was not even rationally determined.[2]  Contrary to this nonsense, Burge insisted that "it is intuitively possible to attribute a mental state or event whose content involves a notion that the subject incompletely understands" (107).  This sounds mild and sensible enough today, but in 1979, Burge rightly felt that it demanded thirty pages of argument.

The (only slightly) less well-known "Belief De Re" (chapter 3) strikes me as being just as fresh as when it first appeared (1977).  (Burge says in a Postscript that it is "the paper in which I began to find my philosophical voice" [65].)  The explicit conclusion is that "de re belief is in important ways more fundamental than the de dicto variety" (44).  However, there is deep philosophical insight in Burge's argument -- particularly in his contention that both empirical knowledge and language acquisition demand de re mental states, because both require mental content "whose truth-value change[s] over relatively short periods of time" (51).  (Recall Quine's "occasion sentences", which "command assent or dissent only as prompted … by current stimulation."[3])  The denotation of such content is determined indexically, Burge argues, and this implies that it is de re.  This argument turns on its head the traditional empiricist adherence to the primacy (or even exclusivity) of de dicto mental content: it turns out that philosophers of an empiricist bent, such as Carnap and Quine, especially need de re mental states -- an ironic conclusion for they are the canonical opponents.  (For a long time, Burge presented Descartes as similarly committed to the primacy of de dicto mental states -- but he has now changed his mind [chapter 19].)

This brings us back to the view, opposite to that of de re fundamentality, that mental states should really be characterized in a way that insulates them from the outside world because anything that can influence thought and behavior is inside the subject (cf. Jerry Fodor's research strategy of "methodological solipsism"[4]).  The claim is that a distinction between narrow and wide content saves individualism.  The wide content of the thought that water contains hydrogen is defined relative to the set of metaphysically possible worlds, and in all of these, water is H2O.  Narrow content is defined by the set of epistemically possible scenarios: i.e., scenarios that are a priori possible given a subject's experiences of water.  It cannot be established a priori that what one experiences as water is not XYZ.  Thus, the narrow content of water-thoughts permits water to be XYZ.  It follows that, as David Chalmers has said: "If we discover that the XYZ-scenario is actual -- that the liquid in the oceans and lakes is XYZ, and so on -- we will then be in a position to conclude that water is XYZ."[5]  It is on this interpretation of 'water' that we have individualistic water-thoughts.  (This is compatible with our also entertaining non-individualist water-thoughts.)

In the Introduction (12-13), Burge essays a swift rejection of the wide/narrow content approach to the Twin Earth/arthritis examples.  The argument is implicit in the discussion of "reinterpretations", especially Section IIIc of "Individualism and the Mental" (121-128).  In this paper, he had claimed (as we saw above) that 'water' in its English sense could not pick out XYZ.  In the Introduction, he repeats the point in somewhat gnomic form: "Thinking about [water] as [water] is thinking about [water] in a way that entails that its denotation or referent is [water]" (12 n).  On one understanding, this is precisely what the proponent of narrow content is denying: Chalmers for one thinks that one can think of water simply as whatever generates one's experiences of water.  On this point, I agree with Burge: 'water' cannot pick out anything but H2O.  Moreover, this is constitutive of its meaning in oblique contexts.  Since 'X believes that …' is an oblique context, 'water' cannot occur within this context in a different sense, for example the one that Chalmers assigns it in narrow content.  When considering counterfactual situations, Burge thinks that we ought to stick to the actual meaning of terms, but Chalmers considers instead the meaning that the term would have had in the counterfactual situation given the same "experiences".

Putting this point aside, a further attack on narrow content is enabled by Burge's argument about 'arthritis' and other descriptive terms.  The content of arthritis-thoughts constrains them not to pick out aches in the thigh, whether the thinker knows it or not.  Burge's anti-individualism with regard to descriptive terms entails that there are no terms with which to characterize narrow content.  As he now says, "the descriptive … notions in terms of which 'narrow content' is specified are themselves constitutively dependent on relations to a wider environment" (12).  Chalmers replies ("Narrow Content", 65, n 7) that this is not the right notion.  Since it is not epistemically necessary that 'arthritis' excludes pains in the thigh, the narrow-content meaning of arthritis covers pains in the thigh -- in the counterfactual situation, the patient does have a narrow arthritis-thought.  Note that both sides of the dispute hold, surprisingly, that analytic truths are not epistemically necessary even for somebody who successfully uses the terms -- 'water' designates H2O by virtue of its meaning, but an English speaker might not know this.

Burge's response to the narrow content view would be that the methodology of content-attribution to mental states would be in doubt under such conditions.  If we cannot inter-substitute analytic equivalents in oblique contexts, it is difficult to interpret such contexts.  When we say that somebody believes that arthritis can occur in the thigh, we do not mean that we find the sentence written in his mind and are free to quibble about its meaning, or to figure out what it might have meant in non-actual circumstances.  Rather, we decide what proposition best explains the believer's mental state and use a sentence that expresses it (with the proviso that this sentence does not positively violate the speaker's commitments).

I suspect that this dispute will not be settled by intuition, but rather by close attention to the methodology of explanation in the cognitive sciences.  Burge undertakes such an examination in "Individualism and Psychology" (chapter 9).  Here he examines David Marr's theory of vision,[6] arguing that certain representational states employed by the visual system get their significance from features of the external environment.  For example, certain states of the visual brain are activated by the presence of "zero-crossings" in the retinal image.  These states, however, are used in a way that can only be explained by the stipulation that they represent "edges", which are sudden spatial discontinuities in external physical variables such as reflectance, illumination, depth, or surface orientation.  Without this stipulation, we cannot make sense of the notion that in certain sorts of situation, the visual system misrepresents the world outside it.  Had external circumstances been different, registering a zero-crossing would not have been the same as representing an edge.

This sort of argument goes well beyond intuition, I believe.[7]  Given Burge's insistence that perceptual states are de re, and that de re attitudes are fundamental, his argument about perception is telling.  It needs explicitly to be extended to the realm of beliefs and other "higher" mental states involving language, and to be backed up by an equally sensitive meta-empirical examination of the origin and role of higher mental states in cognition.  (It should be noted, given the argument concerning Marr, that when Burge expresses the view that "phenomenal consciousness is a matter of phenomenal feeling" [392], he is not assuming, as some do, that "feeling" lacks representational content about the world outside the subject.)

I have tried in this review to convey an idea of what I take to be Burge's major contribution to contemporary philosophy of mind.  There are other riches in this hefty collection: a provocative discussion of Jaegwon Kim's concerns about the explanatory redundancy of the mental (chapter 16), a critique of Ned Block's two kinds of consciousness (chapters 17-18), an argument that contrary to previously held interpretations, Descartes was not an individualist (chapter 19), and a marvelous review of recent work in Philosophy of Mind (Chapter 20).  There is no space to deal with these here.  Suffice it to say that this is a brilliant collection of essays and later reflections by a central figure in philosophy of mind.[8]



[1] Putnam, Mind, Language and Reality: Philosophical Papers, Volume 2, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 227.

[2] Putnam discusses this trend in "The Refutation of Conventionalism," Mind, Language and Reality: 153-191.

[3] W. V. O. Quine, Word and Object, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1960: 36.

[4] Fodor, "Methodological Solipsism Considered as a Research Strategy in Cognitive Science," Behavioral and Brain Sciences 3 (1980): 63-109.

[5] Chalmers, "The Nature of Narrow Content," Philosophical Issues 13 (2003): 44-66; here 48.

[6] Marr, Vision, San Francisco: W. H. Freeman, 1982.

[7] I offered a parallel argument in a paper published two years later: Mohan Matthen, "Biological Functions and Perceptual Content," Journal of Philosophy 85 (1988): 5-27.  The teleosemantic treatment of perceptual content to be found there is anti-individualist.

[8] Profound thanks to my colleague, Gurpreet Rattan, for help with this review.