Peter Geach

Truth and Hope: The Furst Franz Josef und Furstin Gina Lectures Delivered at the International Academy of Philosophy, 1998

Geach, Peter, Truth and Hope: The Furst Franz Josef und Furstin Gina Lectures Delivered at the International Academy of Philosophy, 1998, University of Notre Dame Press, 2001, 112 pp, $25.00 (hbk), ISBN 0-268-04215-2.

Reviewed by Michael J. Murray, Franklin & Marshall College

In a recent conversation with an eminent philosopher reaching the end of his career, I inquired about his recently published book. It struck me that the book defended a number of positions for which the philosopher was well-known with flair, polish, and wit. However, it also seemed to me that the philosophical ground being won in the book was secured only at the expense of giving token attention to the competing views. Why was the loyal opposition given the brush-off, I asked. The answer was: “I am nearing the end of my career. It’s time to stop arguing and to start drawing some conclusions!”

In this most recent work by Peter Geach the strategy is similar. Over the course of seven brief chapters, comprising fewer than one hundred pages of text, Geach treats the reader to a lively and provocative tour of many of his cherished positions. These are not tightly argued technical essays on logic, philosophy of language, and ethics. Rather, Geach focuses on those positions of his that have a direct connection to human practice. It thus provides the reader with a sequence of loosely connected missives offering practical and theoretical advice that read rather like the best “after-dinner” conference talks one has heard.

The seven chapters unfold as follows. In chapter 1, Geach describes various lessons learned from his early reading of McTaggart’s The Nature of Existence. These concern primarily the nature of time, God’s relation to time, and the nature of persons and love.

This is followed, in chapter 2 by a sweeping rejection of contemporary conceptions of human nature, and a defense of the traditional Thomistic position that human beings are essentially rational animals, each one miraculously created. The chapter opens by rejecting the claim that rationality as a differentia fails to pick out human beings uniquely. Geach dismisses Darwin-inspired attempts to regard human reason as distinct from non-human mental activity merely as a matter of degree. Such attempts are rejected by Geach as “mere sophistry, laughable, or pitiable.” Evidence of language acquisition capacities of animals is also dismissed as, at best, association of manual signs with things or performances.

Geach then announces that he will argue that the coming-to-be of all rational animals is miraculous. The argument in the rest of the chapter falls a bit short of that goal. He rather argues that human beings have distinctive mental capacities that cannot be explained by Darwinian processes. It is clear that Geach finds something about human inductive reasoning to be his main evidence for his conclusion, though it is not clear what facet is salient. Animals who can learn to run the maze or avoid the shock can apparently engage in inductive reasoning of some sort. At one point he indicates that it is the human ability to reason inductively in cases where the inductive base requires projection of present regularities into the remote past (e.g., the sort of reasoning required regarding theories in cosmology or, Geach’s example, human evolution). Perhaps the point here is that such inductive reasoning appears to function in a generally reliable way (pace the evolution example) and that there is no reason why natural selection would deliver up inductive reasoners who were so reliable. Still, one takes this to be one of those cases in which non-human animal capacities would be naturally extendable into the sort of cognitive practice Geach identifies.

Chapters three through five consitute a trilogy on consistency, truth, and promising. In chapter four Geach takes up the themes of truth-telling and the obligation to promise-keeping. But before doing so, he provides a general treatment of the nature and importance of consistency and consistent belief. Here Geach argues that inconsistent belief, is “like cherishing a viper in one’s bosom” eventually it will lead to a corrupt practical life as well. In chapter four this theme is extended. Geach goes on to develop a pair of claims, namely, that the basicality of testimony is essential to human mental life, and that this fact underlies the wrongness of lying. Most of the things we believe, and most of our inductive base, derive from testimony. As a result, intentional attempts to undercut the reliability of testimony are intentional attempts to undercut the fabric of human cognitive life.

Interestingly, Geach does not think that attempts to mislead are equally opprobrious. “They may produce the same impressions as direct lies; but they do not, like lies, debase the currency of language.” After all, says Geach, if we were all obliged to speak so as not to mislead our hearers, we would absorb an obligation that could not, even principle, be fulfilled. Perhaps that’s right. But this does not cinch Geach’s point. If one speaks equivocally with the intention to mislead, and one typically succeeds, one is surely acting to undermine the reliability of testimony no less than the direct liar.

Geach continues by arguing for an isomorphism between the wrong of lying and the wrong of promise-breaking. As lying undercuts the fabric of human cognitive activity, so promise-breaking undercuts a certain bit of the fabric of practical activity. Thus, promise-breaking is not wrong because it is tantamount to lying (i.e., a misrepresentation of one’s future intentions), rather it is wrong because of its potential effects on others. Such an account allows us to spell out conditions for permissible promise-breaking, and Geach does so here. He argues that such is permissible when either the promissee releases the promissor from the promise, or the promissee would be harmed by the keeping of the promise. In such cases, the promissor either no longer owes or can no longer deliver the benefit, and thus the obligation is dissolved.

The trilogy is completed in chapter five with some general remarks on the nature of truth and the notion of truth as an end. After dismissing pragmatic and epistemic conceptions of truth in two paragraphs, Geach goes on to commend a species of the correspondence theory he finds in Aquinas. He notes that the chief difficulty for this view is providing truthmakers for negative existential and negative categorical propositions. There is a tantalizingly sketchy discussion of a strategy for solving the problem that is more palatable than some alternatives. The aim of this strategy is to avoid introducing non-being into the truthmaking program, as one finds in Russell’s appeal to negative facts. Geach wants the one reality, the divine creation ultimately rooted in God himself, to be the ultimate truthmaker, and thus to vindicate the claim that God is Truth.

In the last two chapters, Geach provides two forays into philosophy of religion proper. Chapter six deals with the notions of prophecy, Biblical scholarship, evil, and providence. Chapter seven treats the nature of divine goodness.

In chapter 6, Geach returns to themes he has pursued before, and which have taken on some greater urgency in light of recent work in defense of open theism. Like defenders of open theism, Geach defends the claim that instances of specific prophecies must be accounted for as cases of God carrying out his own intentions at some future time. Geach recognizes that this puts at risk, for example, the claim that Judas betrayed Christ freely, but this is a price he and the open theists are (and must be) willing to pay. One might think this is a high price since it appears to make God the author of, and thereby culpable for, human sin. But, Geach continues, this is a less than surprising result when we realize that the very existence of sin is an inscrutable mystery. Appeals to the free will defense (or theodicy) will not do, he claims, since God could have simply given us free choice among only good alternatives. Although Geach does not spell out the suggestion in detail what he has in mind is simple enough: it is surely plausible that God could have wired us so that thoughts of evil acts never occurred to us, while thoughts of diverse good courses of action always would, thus leaving us plenty of genuine alternatives in choice.

This points to an issue in the discussion of free will and evil that requires more attention than it has received, namely, what is the good of the sort of free choice that allows the chooser to choose between good and evil alternatives? Here the theist must tread carefully. If the answer is that such an ability to choose is intrinsically good, then one has to wonder why God, the angels, and the beatified lack the capacity. If it is only instrumentally good, then what good does it serve, and is that good greater than the good served by denying such freedom? A proper account of this instrumental good is yet to be fully given.

Geach also treats the reader to a quite humorous critique of certain techniques employed by Biblical scholars. He points to a line in Pope’s poem Dunciad in which Pope describes the Goddess Dullness as “Something betwixt a Heidegger and owl.” Pope adds a bogus note to the poem describing a Heidegger as “a strange bird from Switzerland and not the name of an eminent person.” Surely, says Geach, scholars of Pope 3000 years from now would conclude that enemies of Heidegger had corrupted the text to “have a bash” at him. Similar convoluted arguments, Geach contends, leads Biblical scholars to reinterpret texts to purge them of the miraculous (in this case, the possibility of their containing genuine prophecy).

In the final chapter, Geach touches on a number of issues concerning divine goodness, whether or not this is the best world, divine impeccability, the nature of divine love and mercy, etc. All of these amount to mere offhand remarks, as would be required to discuss these topics in a mere nine pages. One of the intriguing remarks contained in the chapter concerns another vastly under-explored topic, that of animal suffering. Pain in the animal world is, according to Geach, simply a part of natural teleology. It serves to protect animals from disruption of bodily integrity. But the same providential plan also requires that lions eat wildebeest. When these designs of providence coincide, suffering is the result.

Fair enough, one might think. But this reply seems to fall short of the mark. The problem, of course, is whether or not such pain is sometimes gratuitous. Could integrity be preserved by some other means? And if not, could the pain generating mechanism fail to operate when preserving bodily integrity is not at stake? If not, why not? These are the sorts of questions theodicists are likely to ask here, because, among other things, they are the questions atheists pressing the problem of pain are likely to raise.

Truth and Hope is not, unfortunately, a book for a popular audience. The philosophical sophistication required on the part of the reader in order to follow the lines of inquiry and the offhand remarks preclude that. But for philosophers it will provide a rich resource for reflection on central topics, much in the way volumes such as C.S. Lewis’ collected essays God in the Dock does. These are essays that one will read, and be provoked by, more than once.