2003.04.10

Antiphon the Sophist

The Fragments

Antiphon the Sophist, The Fragments, edited with introduction, translation, and commentary by Gerard J. Pendrick, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 483pp, $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521651611.

Reviewed by Michael Gagarin, University of Texas at Austin


Until now, the standard collection of the fragments of "Antiphon the Sophist" was the magisterial work of Diels-Kranz (Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker, 6 th ed. vol. 2, 334-370 [Berlin 1952]), who established the order and numbering of fragments used by almost all scholars since, including Untersteiner (Sofisti, vol. 4, 1-211 [Florence 1962]). Much has been written about Antiphon since these editions, and in 1984 a tiny scrap of papyrus was published that forced scholars to abandon some generally accepted restorations in a papyrus text published earlier and to reexamine some widespread views about this late fifth-century thinker. Thus a new edition of the fragments has long been desired, and scholars working on the sophists should be most grateful to Pendrick (hereafter 'P') for undertaking not only a new edition but the first extended commentary on the fragments as well. P's work began as a 1987 dissertation written under Leonardo Tarán at Columbia, and this much revised edition has now been published in this handsome edition by Cambridge University Press.

Controversy has long surrounded the figure of Antiphon. We have contemporary evidence from the historian Thucydides (8.68) that in 411 BCE, "Antiphon of Rhamnus" was one of the leaders of the oligarchic coup of the 400, that when democratic government was restored shortly afterwards Antiphon was tried and executed for his role in this coup, and that this same Antiphon advised litigants in court and even wrote speeches for them, of which we now possess three courtroom speeches, three "Tetralogies" (sets of four speeches from the same hypothetical case) and more than a hundred fragments and titles of other speeches. But ancient biographies of this Antiphon regularly confuse him with others of the same name, some of whom are clearly different figures. But there is one Antiphon, identified by the fourth-century writer Xenophon as "Antiphon the Sophist," whose identity has been disputed since at least the first century BCE. Some scholars, ancient and modern, have argued for the "separatist" view that this Antiphon was a different person from the Rhamnusian while other "unitarian" scholars, who in recent years seem to be in the majority, have argued that the two are one and the same. In his dissertation and two earlier articles, P has argued strongly for the separatist position, and he resumes his arguments in a thorough review of the question in the first section of his Introduction. Since I have argued at some length for the unitarian position in a recent work not available to P (Antiphon the Athenian: Oratory, Law, and Justice in the Age of the Sophists [Austin 2002]) I will not rehearse my objections to P's arguments here. Suffice it to say that I am not persuaded. In fact, however, one's view of Antiphon's identity has little or no effect on the value of this work, which will still be of use to both unitarian and separatist scholars. Indeed, I regret not having had it at my disposal when I wrote the above mentioned work.

The rest of P's Introduction addresses the individual works of the Sophist-or the "sophistic" works of Antiphon of Rhamnus, if one takes a unitarian position-the most important of which are On Truth and On Concord. Only a few fragments remain from a Politicus and only reports of a Dream-Book. In a final introductory section, P discusses "Antiphon's Thought in its Fifth-Century Context" (53-67). P's general approach to any interpretation of the works, individually or collectively, is restrained. He primarily examines the attempts of previous scholars to find overall meaning in each work or in all the works taken together, or to find specific responses in Antiphon to other contemporary works. P rejects most of these earlier attempts as wrong or unsupported, and for the most part shows little or no interest in undertaking his own general interpretations ("By its very nature, the fragmentary and incomplete evidence for the writings of the sophist Antiphon steadfastly resists attempts to impose on him a unified and consistent philosophical system"). In his one attempt at a positive assessment of Antiphon's views, on nomos and physis ("law, custom" and "nature"), P concentrates on significant differences between the views of Antiphon and those of Callicles and Thrasymachus (as portrayed by Plato), and notes that "Antiphon envisions a more limited potential for the pursuit of self-interest where the constraints of law and custom seem all-embracing."

Since the publication of the papyrus fragments of On Truth nearly a century ago, Antiphon has been known especially for his views on this issue of nomos and physis, and scholars writing about him have also devoted most of their attention to this issue. But it is worth recalling that without the chance discovery of these papyrus scraps, modern scholars would have almost no idea that Antiphon had even addressed this issue. Fr. 15 on matter as nature (perhaps), gives no hint of any nomos/physis polarity, let alone one with an ethical dimension. Had a different bit of papyrus been preserved, we might have a completely different view of Antiphon as a thinker.

After P's Introduction come twelve Testimonia to Antiphon's sophistic activity, conveniently presented with an English translation facing the Greek text and apparatus criticus. Half of this section is taken up with the first two of these, Xenophon Memorabilia 4.6.1-15 and Hermogenes Peri Ideas 2.15, which are primarily significant for the question of identity. The Testimonia are followed by eighty-one Fragments, again with Greek and English facing.

After these comes the Commentary, which (considering the smaller font used in it) comprises more than half of the work. This is clearly the most important part of P's work. It treats both the Testimonia and the Fragments in discussions ranging from two lines to many pages. It is here that the substantial amount of revision and expansion from the dissertation is most evident. Fragment 1, for example, in the dissertation is nothing but a quotation from Galen with no indication of what part of the text, if any, is Antiphon's original, no translation, and an inconclusive commentary ("it is in fact quite uncertain what Antiphon was saying"). In the book this has become a slightly longer and in places different text of Galen, with an explicit indication of what P takes to be Antiphon's own words, accompanied by a translation and a much fuller commentary. It is disappointing, however, that this additional work does not bring us any closer to understanding the fragment, for after rejecting earlier interpretations P ends by suggesting that in quoting Antiphon Galen may have omitted "something essential to deciphering Antiphon's meaning but superfluous to his own purposes".

The longest section of the commentary, as one would expect, is devoted to the papyrus fragments (F44), which form by far the longest text. P returns the three pieces of this text to the order of the original editors (44 A, B, and C), followed by Diels-Kranz and others, which some recent scholars had changed. This decision is sensible since the actual order is uncertain and it has been confusing to have two different orders. The commentary itself is also generally sensible, though I would take issue with some points, such as equating expressions like ta tês physeôs, "the things of nature," with the noun physis. It may be hard to determine the precise nuance of the first phrase, but it is hard to imagine that Antiphon meant it to be identical with the simple noun.

The book concludes with a 27-page bibliography of works cited and three indices (of passages cited, subjects, and Greek words). The bibliography is nearly complete; I miss only the article of Ronald Billik (TYCHE 1998), who (wrongly, in my view) disputes the assignment of the papyrus fragments (F44) to On Truth and even to Antiphon, and the book of Klaus Hoffmann, Der Recht im Denken der Sophistik, with its fairly extensive interpretation of Antiphon's views in F44.

In sum, P's useful dissertation has now been revised and thoroughly reorganized for publication in ways that make it much easier for the reader to use. On the other hand, the book's origin as a dissertation is still very much in evidence, especially in the unnecessarily lengthy (in my view) discussions of the opinions of virtually all previous scholars going back some 150 years. There may be some value in knowing, for example, what Bernays thought in 1854, but the long discussions of his views and those of scores of other scholars on almost every point are likely to dissuade all but the most dedicated Antiphon devotees from making much use of the book. Readers who might wish to know what P himself, after more than a decade of working on Antiphon, thinks about these fragments will find it rough going, as they skim through the ideas of earlier scholars looking for some indication of P's own views. And when they find it, they are likely to be disappointed, since P's overall approach to interpretation is generally to avoid suggesting views of his own and, when he does venture an interpretation, to restrict himself to a fairly limited point. Thus, the work will be helpful for dedicated specialists like myself, but may not offer much for those interested in the thought of Antiphon or of the sophists more generally.