2008.03.13

Gregg Lambert

Who's Afraid of Deleuze and Guattari?

Gregg Lambert, Who's Afraid of Deleuze and Guattari?, Continuum, 2006, 180pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 0826490484.

Reviewed by Claire Colebrook, University of Edinburgh


Let us begin in media res.  'I see no difference today between fucking and jurisprudence.  It is not by means of the body and its various elements (its blood, its saliva, its various discharges and ejaculations) that the sexual relation is formed out of the body's materiality, but rather by "words and deeds"' (93).  Is this a Deleuzian sentence?  No, if by that you mean the type of discourse and interpretation that is now, according to Lambert, ascendant in literary studies and which threatens to overtake the equally alarming 'machine' of Lacanian studies that has seen Slavoj Žižek grind one event after another through the psychoanalytic reading mill.  It is also not a Deleuzian sentence if we take the industry standard of Deleuzian 'readings' whereby Deleuze is not talking about the linguistic organisation of reality because Deleuze primarily focussed on the 'body and its various elements.'  For Lambert, though, that 'bodily' turn of Deleuze criticism (like the Lacanian and deconstructive turns of the last decades of the twentieth century) is just where academia has failed in response to a potentially renovating body of work.  The symptoms of the failure to ingest Deleuze and Guattari's philosophy in its properly vital manner can be read in the sexual scene, a scene to which Lambert devotes two chapters in which he insists that we should not so readily accept heterosexual ideology's claims to normality and normativity.

Deleuze and Guattari do not, Lambert insists, want us to read, interpret, diagnose or even see as symptomatic, the unconscious; and so the error of all errors would be to see politics as encapsulated in a sexual scene.  If we have turned the sexual relation into the scene whereby my being is fulfilled through some other body that must actualise my fantasies, then the revolutionary plane of the virtual has been reduced to some private scene, and we produce the unconscious as nothing more than a relation among bodies.  What we need to do then is not interpret the unconscious in Deleuzian rather than Lacanian terms, but see the ways in which institutions (from literature departments to Oprah Winfrey and heterosexual pornography) present desire as fantasy instead of seeing the positive power of desire that produced the social and political scene (with a reduced and institutionalised sexuality) in the first place.  So language is important, and the reading of literary language especially so, because it is through order words and the incorporeal transformations that crystallise events -- such as 'September 11' -- that bodies are organised in relation and, most importantly, an unconscious is produced.  This is Lambert's critical bet: we failed to read Lacan because instead of seeing the analytic scene as one in which mastery was produced through readings that claimed to 'interpret' an unconscious, we turned the analytic scene into an industry. Žižek now 'reads' any number of texts, events and phenomena as symptoms of an unconscious topology that can be readily unveiled by a hermeneutic master.  Deleuze and Guattari, Lambert insists, were not anti-Lacanian, for they wanted to save Lacan from such religious and ready-made interpretation machines.  The same needs to be done for Deleuze and Guattari.

Who's Afraid of Deleuze and Guattari? is not a work of serious Deleuze and Guattari exegesis; it does not set out to be.  Nor is Lambert's book an introductory guide, and even less is it a post-exegete's production of a method that one might take from Deleuze and Guattari's work once it has been liberated from its highly idiosyncratic language.  Rather, as the title implies, Who's Afraid of Deleuze and Guattari? is a diagnosis of the institutional failure to really read Deleuze and Guattari's monumental Anti-Oedipus.  In the spirit of Deleuze and Guattari themselves Lambert does not simply point out a series of errors or illusions that plague Deleuze studies, as though Deleuze and Guattari had produced a perfectly rational corpus that had somehow been afflicted by an accidental but lamentable academic stupidity.  If Deleuze and Guattari, whose work is genuinely revolutionary, have been mis-read then this possibility must have its prior potentiality in the writings themselves; one cannot simply dismiss a mis-reading by pointing to a lack of readerly good will or acumen.

Lambert eventually arrives, in the last three chapters of this book, at Deleuze's (rather than Deleuze and Guattari's) insistence on the positive and affirmative nature of difference and the error of a dialectic that would regard social problems and contradictions as the true representatives of difference.  His clearest example is the division of labour, including the sexual division of labour.  As long as we see relations among already differentiated bodies (men and women, or workers and capitalists) then we fail to see the true and productive power of difference that produced a social and political field through this specific mode of differentiation.  This emphasis on a positive and actualising difference, whose virtual power cannot be reduced or exhausted by any of its productions but must instead be seen as productive, is then tied by Lambert to the articulation of real political problems in Deleuze and Guattari's work.  Becoming-woman, for example, is a singular point that might allow for the production of an entirely different social field.  How might such a field appear?  Here is where the first two chapters on the institutionalisation of Deleuze and Guattari in literature departments, and the second two chapters on Deleuze and Guattari's criticism of psychoanalysis, allow Lambert to point out what a better use of Deleuze and Guattari might be.

To do this we need to return to that middle sexual scene: two bodies, both of whom desire in the other an image of sexuality that has been produced through an analytic machine, a machine that allows bodies to be policed, governed and normalised through the production of a privatised and fantasmatic unconscious.  We have failed to read Deleuze and Guattari as long as we remain focussed on interpreting this scene, rather than producing another unconscious that would open up the historical, political, cultural and social field.  This is why Deleuze and Guattari's concept of 'becoming-woman' is both the opening to all other becomings, and a crucial manoeuvre in what Lambert deems to be the issue in contemporary theory and politics.  As long as desire and the political are grounded on the sexual relation -- as in Žižek, but not in the Lacan Lambert would rescue from the theory industry -- then desire is rendered personal, familial and not truly revolutionary.  If Lacan insists that woman does not exist, and that the fantasy of a prohibited feminine that would restore enjoyment is alienation par excellence, then Deleuze and Guattari take the next step of considering desire beyond woman, towards becoming-woman.  This is also where we might ask the question of the governing desire of Lambert's own work, which is to release Deleuze from the critical industries that domesticated Lacan and deconstruction, and that have already threatened to reduce Deleuze and Guattari to an interpretive, rather than productive, machine.  If Deleuze and Guattari's work can, like Lacan's, be rendered into a detachable critical apparatus, and then housed in a relatively unchanged academy, what does this disclose about the critical enterprise, and about the body of work that is so easily digested for its own domesticating ends?  Has critical theory simply suffered from ill will and malevolence in reducing radical texts to ends so radically at odd with their intent, or is there not something inherently self-destructive in any diagnostic critical project?  That is to say, insofar as Deleuze and Guattari aim to posit a revolutionary desire outside capitalism, the sexual couple and interpretation, do they not also create a position for subsequent priests who will also delimit and deride the efforts of their predecessors?  There is a risk today, of narrating literary critical history as a series of linguistically-limited gestures, that will finally be overcome through a becoming-woman that will lead us beyond either the sexual scene of psychoanalysis or the scene of writing of deconstruction.  If Lambert defines himself so intensely against Žižek then he at one and the same time strives to avoid yet one more use of the Oedipal frame as an interpretive organon, while -- perhaps -- allowing the ghost of Oedipus to remain as the ground from which Anti-Oedipus will be launched.