2008.03.25

Ellen K. Feder

Family Bonds: Genealogies of Race and Gender

Ellen K. Feder, Family Bonds: Genealogies of Race and Gender, Oxford University Press, 2007, 145pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780195314755.

Reviewed by Sharon Meagher, University of Scranton


In her wonderfully crafted book, Family Bonds: Genealogies of Race and Gender, Ellen K. Feder provides an original philosophical account of the complex relationships between race and gender.  Feder's analysis begins where most others end:  with the complaint that we seem unable to attend to both race and gender at the same time.  Many philosophers, especially feminists of color, have worked hard to get others to notice our inability to discuss race and gender together.  Feder builds on that work, with a particular indebtedness to that of Hortense Spillers, to provide an account of how and why we repeatedly fail to attend to multiple differences simultaneously, even though we know that they are intertwined.  Feder achieves this by telling stories that reveal the different ways that power acts both within and on families to shape us as gendered and raced persons.

Feder makes three major and interrelated contributions to philosophical scholarship:  (1) she provides a complex, nuanced comparative account of how gender and race work to produce difference and our knowledge of that difference; (2) she offers a convincing argument for a renewed focus on the family as a key to understanding both race and gender, as well as complex modern power relationships more generally; (3) she substantially extends Foucaultian scholarship by moving beyond exegesis to the creation of new genealogies.  While the last accomplishment is considerable, those who are not familiar with Foucault will nevertheless find the argument accessible and compelling.  And those who are not convinced of Foucault's political and philosophical relevance are very likely to be persuaded of it when they read this brilliantly original extension of his work.

Feder's text significantly advances Foucault scholarship by demonstrating connections between his early archaeologies and his later genealogies, arguing that the two are linked in their concern about power (14).  Feder takes great care to reveal her own methodology and how it connects to the work of Foucault.  In the excellent introductory chapter on Foucault's method as well as at key points in the remaining text, Feder clearly explains Foucault's methods, concepts, and terminology to those unfamiliar with his work.  And yet those sections also will be enlightening for those who are.  Feder's clear explanations of Foucault's theory and method provide a model of how to explain Foucault to the uninitiated without oversimplifying.  But even more importantly, Feder makes a persuasive case for seeing continuity between Foucault's earlier archaeologies and his later genealogies because she demonstrates convincingly the interpretive and political value of bringing the two methodologies together in the service of her own analysis.

While one might argue that there are entry points into these issues other than Foucault (and indeed, some readers may be inspired to tell stories using other methodologies to the same effect), Feder provides a compelling case both for including Foucault in this framework and for using his methodology for telling stories.  Foucault's work is productive for Feder's project because he provides a methodology for storytelling that is linked to an analysis of modern power.  Feder argues that Foucault's identification of two types of power -- disciplinary power and biopower -- can account respectively for the ways that gender and racial norms are enforced (16).  In both cases, power works in a way that creates knowledge that masks the production of difference and instead makes it appear natural.

Moreover, the family is the site where both types of power intersect.  Here Feder offers us an important insight by returning us to the famous paradigmatic example that informs Foucault's work -- Bentham's model of the prison he called the "panopticon."  Bentham's ideal prison was constructed in such a way that cells were organized around the circumference of a circle with a guard tower in the center.  Prisoners were thus isolated from one another, but always felt that they were being observed.  The result was that prisoners behaved as if they were observed, even when they were not.  But Feder highlights something often forgotten by Foucault -- in Bentham's model, the guard tower was to be occupied by the warden and his family (15)!  The family thus serves a double role; it is the observer while at the same time it is being observed by inspectors who supervise the wardens (36; 38-44).

By re-locating the family in the panopticon, we see how families are at once the object of constant scrutiny while at the same time they are also the place where social norms are internalized and enforced.  Thus Feder argues persuasively for a return to the family (as both social institution and social norm) as the locus for our analysis of modern power generally and of race and gender more specifically.  While feminists such as Nancy Chodorow were criticized for attending to gender at the expense of ignoring race, Feder argues that the problem cannot be corrected by simply adding race to the analysis as if it operates in the same way; we can see the difference by telling stories that reveal how power operates differently in the case of gender and race even while the two are intertwined.

Taken together, Feder's stories help us better understand both why and how we have difficulty speaking of race and gender together as well as the family's central role in the construction of race and gender norms.  Feder is a powerful storyteller who both chooses her story topics wisely and skillfully culls stories from a remarkable range of complex, interdisciplinary research.  She chooses three stories, each of which highlights one of three "elements of discursive formation" that Foucault uncovers in his archaeology (21, 86), that is, one aspect of the rules that dictate what makes categories such as "gender" and "race" intelligible to us and how those categories shape our understanding of identity and difference.  In the concluding chapter Feder brings out the fourth element of those rules -- identifying the thematic choices or strategies that cause us to privilege one element of difference over another.

The first story that Feder tells is the story of Levittown, the model of post-World War II suburbia.  Urban ethnic families were enticed to purchase developer Levitt's new homes by a complex array of factors that included economic incentives, government policies, and the promise of inclusion in the American dream of home ownership.  The built environment of the development, the formal rules enforced by the developer and the practices internalized and enforced by families all served to create what Feder calls "a new conception of whiteness" (26), that is, an homogenized sense of what it meant to be a suburban dweller that depended on both an erasure of ethnic identities as well as the creation of a new racialized Other.  African Americans were kept out of Levittown and remained in the city.  While at first glance this seems to be a story about race, we learn that it is also a story about gender -- and the family is the thread that interweaves the two.  Suburbs like Levittown created not only a new whiteness, but also a new ideal of what it meant to be a housewife.  Feder's story reveals how one is predicated on the other.  The transformation of urban ethnic families into "white Americans" -- the erasure of racial and ethnic markings -- makes the visibility of a new ideal of femininity possible (38).  Furthermore, it is the family unit which sharpens our vision in this way.  Families are encouraged to see themselves as white suburbanites, but they internalize these norms and reinforce them.  The idealized role of housewife includes the expectation that women will take a leading role in insuring that her family internalizes the proper norms and acts according to community expectations.

Once we uncover the double-role of the family, we can better understand the complexities of race and gender.  In the second story that Feder tells, she shifts the lens to a story about how gender roles are reinforced in the family.  Here Feder tells the story of the emergence of Gender Identity Disorder (GID) as a medical diagnosis of a condition that demands treatment.  Feder's genealogy reveals how the disorder and its treatment tell us something about the construction of gender difference and its appearance as "natural."  A medical diagnosis of GID is made on the basis of children's teasing and responses to children whom they think fail to abide by standard gendered expectations (49).  Once diagnosed, medical professionals work with the family -- especially the mother -- to change the child's behavior so that it fits gender norms and expectations (50-52).  While this story tells us much about how disciplinary power constructs gender difference and locates it as a family responsibility, it also tells us something about the difficulty we have in seeing racial difference if we are focused on gender difference.  The researchers who focus on GID have rarely identified the race of their subjects.

Feder's third story focuses on the violence initiative undertaken in the United States in the 1990s as an attempt to prevent violence by casting it as a public health problem that could be solved by identifying potentially "dangerous individuals" and treating them prophylactically.  While the initial announcement of the federal public policy initiative was made in terms that were identifiably racist, Feder traces how and why the denunciation of the racist terms of the initiative in fact helped support the continuance of the racist practice of identifying young black boys as potential predators (73-81).  The focus on the pursuit of scientific knowledge masks the way state power worked to isolate and identify a group as "dangerous."  Racism depends upon this sort of separation of power and knowledge (70).  And, while this seems like a story about race rather than gender, the story also shows that the treatment of the boys' mothers as monsters rather than mothers demonstrates another complex way in which race and gender are related to one another and converge in the family (81-85).

Feder's genealogies allow us to retrain our eyes so that we can quickly shift focus back and forth, enabling us to better understand the relationships between gender and race (88-90).  Feder helps us understand just how and why stories of race tend to occlude stories of gender, and vice-versa -- because race and gender work somewhat differently in relationship to power and the family.  Race has an external regulative function, while gender has an internal disciplinary one.  Feder's stories also begin to highlight dimensions of socio-economic class and how they intersect with race and gender, but there is clearly much more work that can be done in this regard.  Feder ends with an invitation to us to continue to tell new stories and open up new strategies for resistance and change.

While scholars in political philosophy and theory, feminist theory, and critical race theory will find that this text will advance their own thinking, I also highly recommend this text for adoption in a variety of graduate seminars and advanced undergraduate courses.  The book's path breaking analysis of gender and race commend it for any course that deals with gender, race, and class issues.  I imagine the book will inspire many to create new -- or revive old -- courses on philosophy of the family.  The text is an absolute must for any instructor who wants to demonstrate the power of Foucaultian philosophical analysis in a course on Foucault.  Moreover, this text provides a compelling case for including Foucault (and this analysis in particular) in a course on narrative and ethics or politics.  I imagine that there also will be a demand for individual chapters in courses that would benefit from those specific genealogies.  The chapter on Levittown, for example, will be important for the growing sub-discipline philosophy of place.  Each genealogy is compelling in its own right and can be used productively on its own.  But readers will best benefit from reading the full text to appreciate the complex ways in which the stories are themselves interconnected and construct a powerful way of seeing gender and race.