2008.04.28

Jonardon Ganeri

The Concealed Art of the Soul: Theories of Self and Practices of Truth in Indian Ethics and Epistemology

Jonardon Ganeri, The Concealed Art of the Soul: Theories of Self and Practices of Truth in Indian Ethics and Epistemology, Oxford University Press, 2007, 258pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199202416.

Reviewed by Dan Arnold, University of Chicago


Jonardon Ganeri's most recent contribution to the philosophically engaged study of Indian philosophy represents an interesting departure from much of his earlier work. Carrying on the tradition of B. K. Matilal, who influentially transformed the study of Indian philosophy by recognizing the value of analytic philosophy for coming to understand it, Ganeri brought a background in mathematics to the study of Indian logic and semantics. Naturally enough for someone so inclined, Ganeri generally focused his work through the lens of the later Indian tradition of Navya Nyāya, whose exponents (starting with Gaṅgeśa in the fourteenth century, and continuing well into modern times) developed sophisticated logical and conceptual tools of particular interest to logicians.  Even when he has surveyed  the wider arc of the Indian philosophical traditions (as in his 2001 Philosophy in Classical India: The Proper Work of Reason), Ganeri has typically developed rational reconstructions involving predicate calculus and other such tools of formalization. With the present book, however, Ganeri has not only fixed his attention on earlier moments in the history of the tradition, but has developed his insights in ways that reflect the cultivation of a distinctly literary sensibility.

One might suppose this reflects the influence of Richard Sorabji, who was involved in seminars that gave rise to some parts of this book, and whose work is cited throughout. It would be more to the point, though, to say that Ganeri’s sensitivity to literary form is integral to the book's conception.  For chief among his aims is to consider Indian philosophical texts as intending to transform their readers -- to consider, as Ganeri several times puts it, their character as protreptic, and the difference this makes for interpreting them. To that extent, the book takes an approach similar to Pierre Hadot’s which has influenced students of Indian philosophy.  While Hadot's work is only cited a few times, this book surely reflects Ganeri's own appreciation that many of the Indian philosophical tradition's foundational texts were (as Hadot says of many of the philosophical texts of Western antiquity) "written not so much to inform the reader of a doctrinal content but to form him, to make him traverse a certain itinerary in the course of which he will make spiritual progress."[1]

Hence the reference, in Ganeri's unusually programmatic subtitle, to "practices." It is significant, though, that the subtitular reference is to practices of truth; for also integral to the conception of the book is the thought that attention to the pedagogical or dialogical context of philosophical texts -- to the use of them by their readers, for example, in the cultivation of epistemic virtues -- is not mutually exclusive of attention to the possible truth of the claims they propound. Ganeri is thus concerned, then, with what could be called the perlocutionary effects of foundational Indian philosophical texts -- but also with hermeneutical tools for distinguishing (as Ganeri puts it) their character as variously effective vehicles of meaning, from questions about the truth of the content borne thereby. This book has to do with the kinds of things Indian philosophers have said, for example, about how or whether it is possible to learn something really true -- about the nature and status of the self, but also about truth itself -- by engaging texts whose own status may essentially differ from that of the truth they would have us understand.

Reflecting these various concerns, the book is broadly divided into three parts, which find Ganeri adopting what he takes to be different stances. In Part I -- where the authorial perspective is meant to be "that of a participant located 'inside' the texts" (p.5) -- Ganeri lays out and begins to characterize some of the foundational statements of the basic intuitions informing the subsequent development of India's philosophical trajectories. It is in keeping with the character of these later trajectories that the procedure in Part I should consist largely in gathering and reading basic texts -- chiefly, familiar and influential passages from the Upaniads, from Buddhist texts of the Pāli canon, and (in a chapter that strikes me as less well integrated into the larger arc of the book) from the Mahābhārata. Typical of basically "scholastic" traditions, most schools of Indian philosophy develop out of commentaries on (and commentaries on commentaries on …) such foundational texts. Ganeri's sensitivity to the fundamentally "protreptic" character of such texts (and to their own hermeneutical clues) gives him, though, a good way to make what could be thought a basically Gadamerian point about the nature of philosophical understanding: these foundational texts do not constrain inquiry, but make possible its proper cultivation. As he puts the point,

The reference back to the early texts serves to confirm that the innovation, whatever its origins, counts as a consistent development of the tradition itself. The early texts do exactly what they themselves say they are doing, that is, nourishing a profound investigation into the self and the deep errors about it we are prone to fall into. But by their own admission, it is not their job to perform the investigation for us … . (p.7)

That is, the protreptic character of these texts, as well as their constitutive concern with the nature of (what is on some views only knowable as subjective) the self, are precisely such that they tend to encourage philosophical innovation -- even if (as typical in the traditions of Indian philosophy) that is represented as continuous with a tradition taken to be authoritative.

Thus reading, in Part I, various texts from the Upaniads, Ganeri lays the ground for the elaboration, in Part III, of what he represents as an "irrealist," "non-factualist" account of the self -- one involving the idea that it is a "non-objectual mode or aspect of experience" (p.34) that is constitutive of self-knowledge. Thus, Ganeri proposes that various passages from the Upaniads be read

as saying that the self is caught in the phenomenological quality of thinking, in the flavour of the experience of 'what it is like' to think. There is something that it feels like, from within, to be thinking, and in focusing upon this one is participating in a non-objectual awareness of the self. This is something that cannot directly be 'taught', and it is the reason for the oblique literary form assumed by the Upaniṣadic narrative. (p.35)

That is, the familiarly apophatic character of some centrally influential Upaniads reflects their constitutive concern with the idea of subjectivity as ontologically subjective -- as something that cannot be imagined on the model of our knowledge of objects just insofar as "self-knowledge," on this view, is essentially reflexive and first-personal.

With respect to some of the Buddhist texts canvassed in Part I, hermeneutical considerations are chief among the points to emerge. Thus, for example, Ganeri reads the well-known Buddhist "simile of the raft" -- which famously advances the view that the Buddhist teachings themselves can, like a raft that is no longer needed once it has served its purpose, be jettisoned by one who has "crossed over" with it -- with an eye towards possible Buddhist conceptions of truth. The problem with the (basically pragmatist) account that many have taken to be recommended by this simile is that "the truth of these teachings ceases to have any work to do: that the Buddha's teachings are also true, as well as having great utility, simply drops out of the picture." (p.46) With respect to this and comparable teachings, Ganeri suggests that the point is to appreciate how "the value of truth is internal to a stage of life. The value of truth is internal and conditional, but not for that reason instrumental … ." (p.55) That is, these well-known Buddhist texts can be taken to reflect the tradition's recognition that what anyone is in a position to do with respect to any truth is contingent on the degree and character of her "receptivity" to it. Whether, for example, we are likely to find some truth disheartening or encouraging, or (in an epistemological rather than a psychological key) whether we are justified in believing it, is a function of various facts about us -- but it does not follow from the appreciation of that fact that one cannot suppose there is some really true fact of the matter that is nevertheless at issue.

In Parts II and III, Ganeri then adopts what he takes to be different perspectives from "outside" the texts. I am not sure that the different stances  adopted in the three parts are best characterized in terms of "inside" and "outside".  To read the texts from the "outside", it seems to me, is to read them with an eye towards, for example, the socio-ideological conditions of their production, bracketing any consideration of what they purport to be about. While subsequent philosophical reconstructions of early philosophical intuitions, insofar as they address concerns not explicitly anticipated by their initial formulators, are (one might say) "externally" related to them, they nevertheless treat the foundational texts as being about what they claim to be about. Be that as it may, Ganeri is, in Parts II and III, concerned with what kind of philosophical work might be (and was historically) done on the basis of the texts canvassed in Part I.

Hermeneutical concerns are at the fore in Part II, where the guiding question is: "How can a text whose primary function is therapy of the soul be made to reveal a substantive view about the nature of self?" (p.93) That is, how can texts whose primary mode is thought to be protreptic at the same time be thought to yield contentful claims that might be thought true or false? Of central significance here is the case of "a vehicle of representation [that has] as its content a truth that nevertheless implies that the vehicle itself is empty or unreal or merely illusory … ." (p.106)[2] In this regard, Indian Buddhists of the Madhyamaka school typically appealed to hermeneutical criteria meant to distinguish between "definitive" (nītārtha) teachings, and those "whose sense requires interpretation" (neyārtha) for their proper understanding. According to one traditional statement of such a criterion, texts that teach the "emptiness" (śūnyatā) of all existents are definitive, while anything else -- those, e.g., that apparently refer to existent selves -- must be interpreted in such a way as to be finally compatible with the former. Ganeri can aptly characterize this hermeneutical principle in terms of his governing concerns: "The non-definitive teachings are those which can be interpreted only with respect to their intended protreptic effect, in a particular dialogical context. The definitive teachings are those that can be interpreted in abstraction from any particular dialogical context." (p.108)

He then reconstructs, in terms of the contemporary notion of non-monotonicity, some arguments from the Madhyamaka philosopher Candrakīrti as meant to elaborate on this. On this reading, the point is that monotonicity is differently applicable with regard to truth than with regard to justification:

Logical validity is normally thought to be monotonic; that is to say, an argument's validity is preserved under the addition of new premises … . Epistemic justification, on the other hand, is probably non-monotonic: a belief justified by a given body of evidence might cease to be justified if that body of evidence is supplemented by a piece of new evidence … . (p.110)

While the applicability in the Indian context of the idea of monotonicity has been questioned,[3] Ganeri's use of it affords a useful way to make sense of the characteristically Buddhist idea (which traditionally underwrites the neyārtha / nītārtha distinction) that authoritative Buddhist teachings reflect the Buddha's pedagogical "skillful means":

In the mind of the Buddha's given audience is a set of beliefs p1, p2, … , pn, and these beliefs jointly justify a further belief q inconsistent with the definitive truth. Instead of simply denying or refuting q and leaving the audience to their own devices, the Buddha more skillfully asserts a new belief pn+1. This new belief is tailored to the beliefs of his audience, chosen so that, in conjunction with them, the target belief q is no longer justified. (pp.110-11)

In this way, Ganeri considers the hermeneutical principles that allow Buddhists like Candrakīrti to be sensitive to the transformative work that textual "vehicles" are meant to do on users whose "receptivity" to the truth is contingent and variable (whose epistemic virtues, in a different idiom, are variously cultivated) -- even while remaining intent on arguing that the "definitive" (nītārtha) content borne by these vehicles is really true. An interestingly contrastive case is provided by the Yogācāra philosopher Dharmapāla, whose characteristic appeal to ineffability reflects "an expressivist or emotivist account of the Buddha's discourse" -- the "troubling consequence" of which is that "although Dharmapāla can successfully argue that the Buddha's words are not false, he cannot also argue that they are true. Candrakīrti, in contrast, has some hope of maintaining that things are as the Buddha says they are … ." (p.118) This will not be an uncontroversial claim; Madhyamaka is often characterized as an instance of skepticism, and it should be noted that Candrakīrti, too, often appeals to ineffability. But it seems to me a promising way to account for some of the characteristic statements of Candrakīrti, who did not shrink, after all, from claiming that "essencelessness" (nisvabhāvatā) is itself the "essence" (svabhāva) of things -- which just is to say, on one view of the matter, that it is really true that things lack whatever Candrakīrti means by svabhāva.

Rather more complex, in my view, is the case of the Advaita Vedāntin thinkers Maṇḍanamiśra and Śrīharṣa, whom Ganeri represents as differently responding to the charge (comparable to one recurrently anticipated by proponents of Madhyamaka) that there is a performative self-contradiction involved in thinking that the Upaniads teach that all difference is finally unreal; for their status as texts means that the Upaniads themselves exemplify differentiation between language and reality, among words in a text, between texts, etc. On Ganeri's reading, what these thinkers elaborated to address such problems was a "procedural use of reason" (p.126), and Part II closes with a consideration of this, and of the critique thereof supposedly found in the works of the Mīmāṃsaka Kumārila and the more dualist Vedāntin Rāmānuja.

The prima facie radical view advanced by Maṇḍanamiśra involves embracing the conclusion that insofar as they necessarily exemplify difference, even the Upaniads are in a sense "false" -- but arguing that some false beliefs "can be instrumentally implicated in the manufacture of knowledge." (p.128) Relevant to this discussion is Śrīharṣa's Gettier-like take on the difficulty of ever specifying what is genuinely veridical knowledge:

The possibility of the true guess seems to show that 'true awareness' or 'true belief' alone is not sufficient for knowledge. Adding the further condition, 'produced by a faithful cause' seems promising, but there are serious difficulties with the proposal. If it is meant to introduce a distinction among the causes of true mental states, so that we can say of some that they are not caused in the right way, then we cannot define a 'faithful' cause simply as one such as to produce … true beliefs. This is Śrīharṣa's challenge to traditional Indian theories of knowledge. (pp.135-36)[4]

Among the problems Śrīharṣa thus shows, I take it, is that of how to specify which (from among the many different) causes of cognition are at the same time what it is about which we are justified in forming beliefs; for we could be in a position to specify this only if we presuppose the reliability of our ways of picking out the relevant causes -- but if we could already do that, then we would not have any problem in the first place.

Similarly in regard to causal analyses of knowledge, Maṇḍanamiśra, on Ganeri's reading, can be credited with having seen (what the Indian tradition is more generally thought not to have thematized) the difference between reasons and causes. (Not insignificantly, the Sanskrit word hetu is commonly used by Indian philosophers to refer to both.) Thus, Ganeri takes Maṇḍana to have seen that "causal priority does not imply logical or evidential priority." (p.140) The point is here meant to further the case for doubting that we could ever be in a position to specify that beliefs can be true only insofar as they are caused by really obtaining states of affairs -- which is, in turn, central to the case for thinking that the Upaniads can themselves exemplify (just insofar as they are texts) the kind of multiplicity that these thinkers consider finally unreal, but nevertheless effectively convey the latter truth.

There is surely much to be said both for and against the "first-personal but externalist conception of the project of epistemology" (pp.143-44) that Ganeri thus develops and attributes to Maṇḍanamiśra. Among the points that strike me as problematic is that several of the foregoing views are arguably just the ones elaborated by the Mīmāṃsaka Kumārila (whom Ganeri takes as one of the main critics of the foregoing approach), whose signal contribution to Indian epistemological discourse is his characteristic doctrine of svata prāmāya -- the doctrine, we might say, of the "intrinsic credibility" of cognitions. Making the case for this doctrine, Kumārila argued that the status of any doxastic practice (pramāa) as the reliable practice it is cannot be shown without epistemic circularity; if, for example, one wants to know not whether some particular perception of a tree is veridical, but whether perception, as such, is a reliable way of knowing this, the answer cannot be that this is known based on something else -- for the only thing such knowledge could be based on would be other pramāas, and whether these are reliable is just what we want to know in this case.

Thus, all that any way of knowing can yield is prima facie justification, and our doxastic practices must, on pain of infinite regress, intrinsically have the capacity to confer this -- they cannot, that is, be thought to do so only insofar as some other way of knowing shows that they do. On some readings, though -- particularly that recommended by the commentator Pārthasārathimiśra -- the point here, as in much contemporary "reformed epistemology," is just to undermine the very causal accounts of knowing that Maṇḍanamiśra and Śrīharṣa themselves attack.[5] While Maṇḍanamiśra and Śrīharṣa, as Vedāntins, surely credit as authoritative a different part of the Vedic corpus (viz., the Upaniads) than does Kumārila, there is nevertheless an important extent to which they are epistemological fellow travelers.

That Ganeri here may thus be conflating a few different lines of argument is further suggested by his gloss of the doctrine of svata prāmāya as "the indefeasibilist principle" (p.149n). To be sure, the epistemology of svata prāmāya is advanced by Kumārila together with the claim that the justification conferred by the Vedas is uniquely indefeasible, since the Vedas have the peculiar property of being authorless -- which crucially means, on the Mīmāṃsaka view, that there is nothing about them (such as the mendacity or the epistemic limits of the speaker whose intention they might otherwise be thought to express) that could issue in the overriding of the beliefs they engender. But this idea that only certain things internal to the "linguistic" doxastic practice (śabda-pramāa) could count as overriding its outputs is, as Kumārila explicitly says,[6] an additional axiom (sthiti) -- it is not itself integral to the doctrine of svata prāmāya, which by itself can allow that (as Ganeri says of a conclusion that he apparently takes to counter the doctrine of svata prāmāya) "a belief might be false even in maximally ideal cognitive conditions." (p.149)

Kumārila's is arguably, then, also an eminently fallibilist epistemology, even if it involves a move meant to secure the uniquely authoritative status of the Vedas. Indeed, Pārthasārathimiśra makes the cogent point that we cannot make sense of the idea of falsification that figures centrally in Kumārila's doctrine unless we allow that a cognition's having conferred prima facie justification (prāmāya) is independent of whether it might finally be judged to have been veridical -- to have been, that is, a real pramāa.[7] The possibility of a justified belief's being overridden is positively integral, then, to this account's maintaining a realist conception of truth. The case for the "procedural" epistemology scouted in Ganeri's Chapter 5 may, then, not fit all that neatly into Ganeri's larger dialectic.

Thus having considered some of the Indian tradition's various hermeneutical and epistemological tools for distinguishing the "workly" aspects of textual vehicles from the possibly true content borne thereby -- for distinguishing, in a different idiom, justification from truth -- Ganeri finally turns, in Part III, to the philosophically constructive elaboration of some of the Indian tradition's major arguments regarding the status of the self. His treatment is structured in terms of two pairs of views. As examples of "realist" views, Ganeri considers the "non-reductive realism" of Nyāya chiefly insofar as it represents a challenge to the reductionist realism of the Buddhist Vasubandhu, which is elaborated at much greater length; the two "irrealist" views he then considers are the "error-theoretic" account of Advaita Vedānta, and (at much greater length) the "non-factualist" account that he finds exemplified not only by the Buddhist school of Madhyamaka, but also (possibly contra some Advaita Vedāntin interpretations of these) by the Upaniads surveyed in Part I.

This way of laying out the options will likely remind many readers of the structure of Mark Siderits's Personal Identity and Buddhist Philosophy (Ashgate, 2003), which similarly treats the broadly reductionist elaboration of Buddhist doctrine as constitutively realist, and as setting up a critique of that by the Madhyamaka school, which Siderits reconstructs as having developed a sophisticated "semantic anti-realism." Ganeri notes, however, that Siderits's specifically semantic anti-realism (which is informed by Dummett) represents an alternative paradigm for irrealism, and says that "it isn't clear to me that this paradigm is available in an account of the language of self." (p.188n) Given the justly influential character of Siderits's book, further elaboration of this point would have been welcome, but as it is, we must try on our own to discern the significance of Ganeri's difference from Siderits.

Ganeri begins, in any case, by considering some of the arguments for Vasubandhu's reductionism. Here, he adds welcome nuance to Derek Parfit's brief but influential engagement with Buddhist thought, which has figured prominently in much of the recent philosophical study of Vasubandhu. He notes, for example, Parfit's own retreat from the "impersonal description" thesis that had figured in Reasons and Persons. This had held (Ganeri says) that "we could give a complete description of reality without mentioning persons" (p.161), but was abandoned by Parfit under the pressure of critics who had pressed the basically Kantian argument (variations on which were also advanced by some Indian opponents of Buddhism) that "talk of flows of experience depends on talk of persons … one cannot talk about the first and not the second … ." (p.161) Parfit understands his own view, in any case, as rejecting the strong position that he characterizes as "the Buddhist View": "[t]here are no persons, thinkers, or agents. There are only persisting bodies and related sequences of thoughts, experiences, and acts." (p.161, quoting Parfit)

Against this, Ganeri is surely right to urge that, at least with respect to their avowed aims, "None of our Buddhists … holds to what Parfit has called 'the Buddhist View'. Indeed this is ucchedavāda, nihilism, one of the two extremes between which the Buddha sought a Middle Way … ." (p.166) Buddhists typically claim, in this regard, that while "persons" do not belong in a final ontology (they are not, as Buddhists say, paramārthasat, "ultimately existent"), they nevertheless figure in the ordinary discourse that has what Buddhists call "conventional truth" (savtisatya). Whether or not Buddhist proponents of the two truths successfully avoid the eliminativism that Parfit seems to take for "the Buddhist View" is, however, clearly a function of just what kind of explanatory work is meant to be done by the "ultimately true" level of description. Among the forms this level takes, in Vasubandhu's Abhidharmakośa, is that of an enumeration of ontological primitives (which Buddhists called dharmas) -- and if it is right to say that everything to do with persons can finally be explained in terms of the impersonal dharma-language, then it is hard to see how to avoid the conclusion that everything about the personal level of description is finally epiphenomenal (and hence, eliminable from our account).

Ganeri, though, reads Vasubandhu as upholding a more moderate view according to which "[t]he distinction between the 'two truths' is not a distinction between reality and mere appearance, or between fact and fiction. It is a distinction between better and worse but nevertheless objective ways of thinking." (p.174) While this is surely a defensible reading of Vasubandhu, it seems to me that it is rather more like Madhyamaka than like Vasubandhu thus to soften the status of paramārthasat as a privileged level of description. Perhaps, though, Ganeri would rejoin that I read Vasubandhu too much through the lens of Dharmakīrti; Ganeri does seem to allow (p.174n), in this regard, that Dharmakīrti's peculiarly causal elaboration of the ultimate truth -- an account according to which efficient-causal efficacy is the criterion of being ultimately real, giving the contrast between "ultimately true" and "person-level" descriptions a surprising resonance with some cognitive-scientific accounts -- would make the two truths idea look rather different.[8]

After canvassing some of the problems that Indian philosophers raised for Vasubandhu's reductionism, Ganeri turns in his final chapter to the "performativist" (p.189n) account of the self that represents Madhyamaka's "irrealist" alternative to Vasubandhu's form of realism. What characterizes this view as "irrealist" is the refusal not only (contra Vasubandhu) that selves are "reducible to streams," but also that "they have a substantial existence distinct from the stream." (p.186) Irrealism, instead, names a view on which the "language of self" is simply non-referring. Thus, while the "error-theoretic" version of irrealism that Ganeri attributes to the Vedāntin Maṇḍanamiśra "concurs with the realist that the language of self is a language of referring terms, and of claims made true by the properties of entities so referred to" -- differing from the realist simply in denying "that there are, in fact, entities of the kind in question" -- the "non-factual" irrealism of Madhyamaka "rejects the assumption shared by the realist and the error-theoretic irrealist, the assumption that the language of self is genuinely representational." (p.188)

This characterization represents, I think, a promising way to show how the Madhyamaka account of the two truths more easily avoids the eliminative extreme than does Vasubandhu's; for insofar as the claim is that there simply could not be the kind of reference that self-talk seems to require, it makes no more sense to say the self does not exist than that it does. Such a position may, however, finally be (what the "irrealism" moniker could be thought to deny) a constitutively metaphysical one; for the claim that certain reference conditions could not obtain -- that (as I would prefer to put the point that proponents of Madhyamaka may thus be after) essentially causal accounts of the truth-making relation cannot finally be sustained -- is in the end stronger than the "error-theoretic" claim that a certain kind of referent simply happens not to be instantiated.

On my reading of his reconstruction, Ganeri's position is compatible with such a metaphysical claim -- which turns out indeed to resonate with Part I's interpretation of (Ganeri's other exemplar of a "non-factualist irrealist" approach) the Upaniads. Central to his case is a single verse from the fourth-century Madhyamaka Āryadeva, which he renders thus: "That which is self to you is not self to me; from this fixed rule it follows that that is not self. Indeed, the construction (kalpanā) [of a sense of self] arises out of the impermanent things." (p.191) Notwithstanding some indeterminacy in this passage,[9] I find Ganeri's interpretation of its purport convincing:

Lacking the concept of self, I would not be able to draw the distinction between what is mine and what is yours … . It is our capacity to make that distinction to which Āryadeva draws our attention when he says that 'that which is self to you is not self to me'. What we have, then, is an adequacy condition on potential theories of self. (p.191)

The point is then that the theories Āryadeva considers fail that condition. Ganeri suggests, in this regard, that "[t]he target of this argument is any substance theory of self." (p.192) But it seems clear from Ganeri's account of the reasoning that the point here should be understood to cut as much against Vasubandhu's reductionism as against non-reductive realism. He says:

our concept of an object is a concept of something public, an inhabitant of a shared world, something that can equally well and simultaneously be the common focus of your and my attention. To reify the self, to explain our possession of a concept of self on the model of our possession of the concept of an object, is thus precisely to render one incapable of explaining why we have the concept of self in the first place. (pp.191-92)

Āryadeva's argument thus involves a point not unlike the one Ganeri earlier took the Upaniads to have made about the constitutively "non-objectual" character of self-knowledge: no theory of self that takes it to be some kind of thing -- or, pace Vasubandhu, reducible to some kinds of things -- can account for the very fact that a theory of self is supposed to be a theory of (i.e., its reflexively first-personal character). Ganeri takes the later Madhyamaka Candrakīrti similarly to have argued that "the idea that 'I' refers to a soul is not even part of our folk concept … . The idea of a soul is an idle wheel in the explanation of self; accepting or rejecting it does no work in accounting for the facts of selfhood." (p.198) Candrakīrti's alternative account then provides the basis for Ganeri's characterization of the Madhyamaka view as a "performativist" one; for Candrakīrti, ringing the changes on an earlier Buddhist notion of the "person" as the "appropriator" (upādāt) of its parts, emphasizes that "[t]he appropriation in question is to be thought of as an activity of laying claim to, not the making of an assertion of ownership." (p.202)

Perhaps what the proponent of Madhyamaka most strongly resists, then, is any view on which the self is either equivalent with or reducible to specifiable objects having determinate identity criteria. Any such view will here be thought problematic not only insofar as real causal relations between such objects cannot coherently be explained (a point of particular focus for proponents of Madhyamaka), but also insofar as any such view necessarily leaves out the constitutively dynamic (Ganeri: performative) character of subjectivity; any idea of self that involves specific identity criteria (whether those of its "essence" or of its parts) leaves out, that is, the essentially temporal character of subjective immediacy, which always and elusively "obtains" (if even that much can be said) only in the present. However we unpack the basic insight here, though, Ganeri is surely right to say (as he does in the slightly different context of his Appendix C) that "[i]t is curious to see … how the Buddhist denial of self and the Upaniṣadic universalization of self partake in a common diagnosis of the origins of suffering, the roots of which in both cases are seen to lie with the erroneous idea that minds have real boundaries." (p.228)

There is of course much more to be said about the interpretation of Madhyamaka with which Ganeri thus concludes the main body of his book. Among the points this interpretation leaves in question is how (or even whether) the proponent of such a view of Madhyamaka can make sense of our habitually clinging to such views of the self as the Buddhist would have us overcome. How, that is, can the views of the self targeted by Madhyamaka be simply incoherent -- "not even part of our folk concept," as Ganeri rightly says that Candrakīrti sometimes maintains -- and yet so deeply inform our habitually misguided ways of being? How, in other words, can the whole Buddhist project itself be called for, if what Buddhists would have us realize is that we cannot even coherently think of ourselves in the way that, on the Buddhist's own diagnosis, we always do?

Not only are some such central questions not raised here, but the book peters out with a striking lack of closure.  The last chapter ends with no indication that it is the end of a larger work, and the consequent air of diffuseness is heightened by the appendices (which pick up some tangents that are more or less thematically related to the book as a whole; most interesting among these is one on "Schopenhauer's conceptions of a concealed self," and the question of his knowledge of and relation to the Upaniads). It is not hard to conclude, on finishing the book, that it is not a particularly unified work, and that Ganeri has not, in the end, elaborated a coherent or precise concept of "practices of truth." On a more charitable reading, though -- one that is warranted by Ganeri's own sensitivity to the workly, "protreptic" character of philosophical texts -- Ganeri's book could instead be said itself to perform something of the extent to which it is not the job of any philosophical study of the self "to perform the investigation for us." Perhaps, that is, it is in the nature of "practices of truth" that they are better exemplified or undertaken than made an object of study.



[1] Pierre Hadot, Philosophy as a Way of Life: Spiritual Exercises from Socrates to Foucault (Oxford: Blackwell, 1995), p.64.

[2] Something like the same issue has been interestingly and influentially considered, vis-à-vis the Madhyamaka school of Buddhist philosophy, by Jay Garfield and Graham Priest in terms of Priest's "trans-" or "para-consistent" logic; see Garfield and Priest, "Nāgārjuna and the Limits of Thought," Philosophy East and West 53/1 (2003): 1-21.

[3] See, e.g., John Taber, "Is Indian Logic Nonmonotonic?" Philosophy East and West 54/2 (2004): 143-170.

[4] My ellipsis here simply elides a misprint: "… cause simply as one such as to produce as true beliefs."

[5] For a full development of such a reading of svata prāmāya, see my Buddhists, Brahmins, and Belief: Epistemology in South Asian Philosophy of Religion (Columbia University Press, 2005), Part II; and John Taber, "What Did Kumārila Bhaṭṭa Mean by Svata Prāmāya?" Journal of the American Oriental Society 112/3-4 (1992): 204-221.

[6] At Ślokavārttika, codanā 62ab; see Buddhists, Brahmins, and Belief, pp.112, p.256, n.74.

[7] See, especially, Buddhists, Brahmins, and Belief, pp.103-110.

[8] The passage from Dharmakīrti to which Ganeri refers in his footnote here can be translated thus: "Whatever has the capacity for causal efficacy is here said to be ultimately existent; everything else is conventionally existent. These two [sets consist, respectively, in] unique particulars and abstractions."

[9] Ganeri notes (p.191n), somewhat unclearly, that the text of Āryadeva's passage is ambiguous between "from a fixed rule" (niyamāt) and "from the absence of a fixed rule" (aniyamāt). This is because Sanskrit rules for vowel coalescence have the effect of obscuring the alpha-privative here, so that there is no difference between ātmā niyamāt and ātmā-aniyamāt. Karen Lang's translation of the same passage (Āryadeva's Catuśataka, Copenhagen, 1986, p.95) reads the passage the latter way, and her more straightforward rendering might just as well support Ganeri's interpretation: "Your self is not my self, consequently, because it is not fixed (aniyama), the self does not [truly] exist. Certainly, a conception [of a self] can be based [only] on impermanent things."