2008.05.04

Ernest Sosa

A Virtue Epistemology: Apt Belief and Reflective Knowledge, Volume 1

Ernest Sosa, A Virtue Epistemology: Apt Belief and Reflective Knowledge, Volume 1, Oxford University Press, 2007, 149pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199297023.

Reviewed by Ram Neta, University of North Carolina at Chapel Hill


If you are interested enough in epistemology to be reading this review, then you must read the marvelous book being reviewed. It consists of the six Locke lectures that Ernest Sosa gave at Oxford in 2005, along with an appendix that covers a few topics in more detail. While many bits and pieces of Sosa's work are already well known to everyone working in epistemology, they are known primarily through various papers that Sosa has written, and it is not generally well understood just how the views put forward in those many papers fit together to form a coherent and explanatorily powerful epistemology. Reading this book helps one to understand that.

The primary aim of the book is to answer the following three related questions: What is knowledge? In what way is it generally better to know than merely to have a true belief? And how is it possible, various skeptical arguments notwithstanding, for us to have knowledge (including knowledge of the answers to these very questions)? Sosa's answer to each of these questions helps to support and explain his answers to the others, and so there is no uniquely natural point from which to begin expounding his view.

Let's begin with Sosa's answer to the question "what is knowledge?" Knowledge, according to Sosa, comes at two levels. First, there is the kind of knowledge that human beings share with creatures who are not capable of theorizing: this is what Sosa calls "animal knowledge". Then, there is a kind of knowledge that is possessed only by creatures capable of theorizing: this is what Sosa calls "reflective knowledge". For a creature to have animal knowledge that p is for that creature to believe accurately that p, and for that belief to result from that creature's exercise of an epistemic competence (for the belief to be, as Sosa says, "adroit"), and for that belief to be accurate precisely because it is adroit (for the belief to be, as Sosa says, "apt"). In short, for a creature to have animal knowledge that p is for that creature to have an apt belief that p -- a belief that is accurate because it is adroit. For someone to have reflective knowledge that p is for her to believe that she aptly believes that p, and for this higher-order belief itself to be accurate because it results from the exercise of a competence that enables one to defend one's beliefs against challenges (including skeptical challenges). Thus, for someone to have reflective knowledge that p is for her aptly to believe that she aptly believes that p. To have such iterated apt belief requires being able to defend the content of one's belief against skeptical challenges. (This is of course not to say that possessing reflective knowledge requires actually defending one's belief against skeptical challenges: one can possess reflective knowledge without having skeptical challenges ever cross one's mind.)

Notice that, in characterizing both animal knowledge and reflective knowledge, Sosa appeals to the notion of a competence, or (equivalently) an ability. But the latter notion is a highly generic, ordinary notion that is not specific to epistemology, and that Sosa does not attempt to explicate in any detail. What makes Sosa's a "virtue" epistemology is precisely that it explains what knowledge is by appeal to the generic, ordinary notion of a competence. Why does Sosa try to explain what knowledge is in this way, rather than, say, (as Goldman does) by appeal to reliable belief-forming processes, or (as Russell once did) by appeal to what truths best explain (or can otherwise be properly inferred from) the facts of which we are directly aware? We can see why Sosa prefers his own virtue epistemology to Goldman's reliabilism if we consider what resources Sosa has (and Goldman allegedly lacks) for explaining how knowledge is better than mere true belief. And we can see why Sosa prefers his own virtue epistemology to the epistemology offered by internalists such as Russell if we consider what resources Sosa has (and Russell allegedly lacks) for stopping the regress of justifications and solving the problem(s) of the criterion.

Consider how Sosa's virtue epistemology can improve upon Goldman's reliabilism in specifying a way in which knowledge is better than mere true belief. To say that one thing is "better than" another is to make a relative evaluation of the two things, or to measure them along some scale of value. Now, if we focus our attention on a particular proposition, then it may be that, along some scales of value, knowledge of the truth of that proposition is better than mere true belief in that proposition, while along other scales of value, the reverse is true. (Perhaps, if the burglar knows that the diamonds are in the house, he will ransack the house all night trying to find them, and then get apprehended by the police when they arrive in the morning. But if he merely believes, albeit truly, that the diamonds are in the house, he will stop searching for them as soon as he doesn't find them in the most likely place, and so leave the house before the police arrive.) Nonetheless, Sosa takes there to be a scale of value which is such that, for any proposition whatsoever, and under any circumstances whatsoever, knowledge of the truth of that proposition is better -- along that posited scale of value -- than mere true belief in that proposition. What makes something occupy a particular position on this scale of value? Some epistemologists ("truth monists") think that the only thing that can make something occupy a particular position on this scale of value is something about its relation to truth; truth is, in this sense, the epistemically fundamental value (and this can be the case whether or not truth is itself valuable in any non-epistemic way). But, given that both knowledge and merely true belief are true, how can one be any better, along such a scale, than the other? Goldman might be tempted to say that knowledge is better than merely true belief because knowledge is formed by a process that tends to form true beliefs. But how can this be the correct answer to our question? Good coffee that is made by a reliable coffee machine is no better than good coffee that is made by an unreliable coffee machine, so why should a true belief that is reliably produced be any better than a true belief that is not reliably produced?

Sosa thinks that, in order to identify the scale of value that we are seeking, we must give up truth monism, and recognize that aptness is itself an epistemically fundamental value. But, according to Sosa, we can reasonably think of aptness as an epistemically fundamental value only if we think of beliefs, like performances, as exercises of a competence, rather than as outputs of a process. The output of a process is no better or worse for having been made by that process: its quality is not determined by how it was produced. But a performance is better or worse for being the exercise of a particular competence: the archer who displays skill in hitting the bull's-eye makes a better shot than the unskilled archer whose dumb luck it is to hit a bull's-eye. The way to explain why knowledge is better than true belief is to claim that the quality of a belief, like the quality of a performance, depends (in part) upon the quality of the competence exercised in it. Thus, Sosa thinks, in depicting beliefs as products of a more or less reliable process, the reliabilist gives us a picture of belief that makes it impossible to explain how knowledge is better than true belief, whereas Sosa's virtue epistemology can easily explain this, by virtue of depicting beliefs (like performances) as exercises of a competence.

This is one of the main reasons that Sosa provides in this volume for preferring virtue epistemology to reliabilism. But why prefer virtue epistemology to an internalist alternative, like, say, Russell's foundationalism? While a number of Sosa's other writings discuss the problem of the speckled hen that arises for internalist foundationalist accounts of empirical knowledge or justification,[1] Sosa does not discuss that problem in the present volume. Rather, he argues that internalist foundationalism cannot account for the role that our intuitions play in providing us with a priori knowledge.

According to an internalist foundationalist, what role do intuitions play in giving us a priori knowledge? Such intuitions must somehow stop the regress of a priori justifications, and the only way that they can do this is by providing a priori justification without requiring it themselves (i.e., without themselves being evaluable as justified or unjustified). So a foundationally justified a priori belief, like 0 < 1, must be justified by an intuition, which is something distinct from the belief, and accessible to reflection, and not itself evaluable with respect to justification. But, Sosa thinks, there simply is no such thing: there is nothing distinct from my belief that 0 < 1, that is accessible to reflection, and that both justifies that belief and is itself not evaluable with respect to justification. What justifies my belief that 0 < 1 is my attraction to that belief, but this attraction can be justified or unjustified: I may be justifiably attracted to the belief, or unjustifiably attracted to it. Since the attraction is itself evaluable with respect to justification, it cannot stop the regress of justification. Since the thing that justifies my a priori belief is not a regress-stopper, the internalist foundationalist cannot account for such a priori knowledge.

Can the internalist solve this problem by rejecting foundationalism, and accepting some form of coherentism or infinitism instead? No. For according to Sosa, what justifies my attraction to the belief that 0 < 1 is not any other belief or experience of mine; what could that belief or experience possibly be? The only plausible account of what justifies my attraction to the belief that 0 < 1 is that this attraction is a proper exercise of my epistemic competence. And since, for Sosa, this fact about the attraction is not a fact that is accessible to introspection or reflection, it is not a fact that the internalist can admit into her account of what justifies my belief. Thus, internalism cannot give an adequate account of our a priori knowledge. Since internalism cannot give an adequate account of our a priori knowledge, it also cannot give an adequate account of our knowledge of epistemological principles, and so cannot explain how we can achieve a knowledgeable perspective on our own knowledge. And without being able to explain this, internalism cannot provide us with a way to solve the problem(s) of the criterion.

This completes my necessarily brief and woefully incomplete exposition of Sosa's virtue epistemology, and why he takes it to be an improvement on reliabilism and internalism. His virtue epistemology provides an answer to the question what knowledge is; this answer is to be preferred to reliabilism because (inter alia) the former, unlike the latter, can provide an adequate answer to the question of how knowledge is generally better than merely true belief; and it is to be preferred to internalism because the former, unlike the latter, can provide an explanation of how knowledge is possible. In this exposition, I have had to ignore much of what is fascinating in Sosa's book (e.g., his novel view of the nature of dreams, the role he accords basis-relative safety in knowledge, his original interpretation of Descartes). But I want to close by raising a question about Sosa's argument against internalism. The crux of that argument, recall, was that internalism cannot offer an adequate account of our a priori knowledge, because there are no mental states that can serve to stop the regress of a priori justification (or, at least, there are no mental states accessible to the believer's own powers of reflection that can do so). The only thing that justifies my belief that, say, 0 < 1, is my justified attraction to that belief, and the only thing that justifies that attraction is the fact (allegedly inaccessible to my reflection) that it consists in the proper exercise of a competence.

Now, could the very fact that 0 < 1, a fact that is accessible to me upon reflection, be what justifies my belief that 0 < 1? Sosa argues that, if we claim that the very fact that 0 < 1 is what justifies my belief that 0 < 1, then we will have to explain why that fact justifies my belief in it, whereas the fact (supposing it is a fact) that the axiom of choice is true does not justify my belief in it. If both facts are, in principle, epistemically accessible upon reflection, then why is it that only the first is actually accessed by me (even if, as it happens, I believe both)? Sosa thinks that, in order to answer this question, we must appeal to the fact that I properly exercise my powers of reflective knowledge in believing the first fact, but not in believing the second. Let's grant that he is right to say this. Still, this is inconsistent with internalism only if the fact that I properly exercise my powers of reflective knowledge in believing that 0 < 1 is itself not accessible to my powers of reflection. But why should we think that it is not accessible to my powers of reflection?

Perhaps we should think that facts about whether I am properly exercising one of my epistemic powers are inaccessible to my powers of reflection because they are facts about the causal order. But consider the fact that my attention is now directed to a particular red spot in my visual field, and I am accurately tracking this single red spot as it moves across the field. This fact about the accuracy of my tracking is also a fact about the causal order, and yet it seems clearly to be accessible to me upon reflection. Why not allow that the fact that I am accurately reflecting upon the fact that 0 < 1 is also accessible to me upon reflection?

Of course, to allow this is not to imply that we are not subject to error in our beliefs about our own reflective powers. It might frequently happen that we falsely believe that we are properly exercising our powers of reflection when, in fact, we are not doing so. Furthermore, when we are improperly exercising our powers of reflection, that fact may be inaccessible to us. But none of this implies that when we are properly exercising our powers of reflection, that fact is not accessible to us. So what reason is there to think that, when we are properly exercising our powers of reflection in reflecting upon some fact, the very fact that we are doing so is not itself accessible to our own powers of reflection? In order for Sosa to make his case against internalism, and to show that some appeal to virtue is necessary for an adequate account of knowledge, he must provide an answer to this question.



[1] See, for instance, Sosa's contribution to the volume Epistemic Justification (Oxford, 2003).