2008.05.13

Cheryl Misak (ed.)

New Pragmatists

Cheryl Misak (ed.), New Pragmatists, Oxford University Press, 2007, 195pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199279975.

Reviewed by Henry Jackman, York University


After William James published his Pragmatism in 1907, C.S. Peirce changed the name of his own position from "pragmatism" to "pragmaticism" in order to disassociate himself from what he took to be the overly 'subjective' aspects of James's newly topical view. This tension between Peirce and James persists today, and Cheryl Misak usefully distinguishes the Jamesian strain of "Neo-Pragmatism", most famously associated with Richard Rorty, from what she calls the "New Pragmatism", a position that stands to Neo-Pragmatism as Peirce did to James.[1] Misak considers it characteristic of New Pragmatists to think that "standards of objectivity come into being and evolve over time, but that being historically situated in this way does not detract from their objectivity" (p. 2), but precisely where the lines are between, say, Metaphysical Realism, New Pragmatism and Neo-Pragmatism remains hard to specify, and what a worked out New Pragmatism would look like appears to be different in each of the eight essays in this excellent collection.

All of the papers are new with the volume, and in what follows I'll only be able to highlight some themes that run through groups of the essays, along with some differences between the authors involved. Such themes will include (1) the relation of the New Pragmatism to its classical predecessors, (2) just how robust an account of truth and objectivity New Pragmatism can be expected to offer, and (3) whether or not the New Pragmatism should provide an account of truth and objectivity for all of the language or just some subset of it. Unfortunately, much that would be worth discussing must be left out, but I hope to at least give a feel for some of the concerns driving this consistently engaging collection of papers.

Some New Pragmatists are less tied to the classical pragmatists than others, and in no case is this more clear than in Ian Hacking's "On Not Being a Pragmatist: Eight Reasons and a Cause", in which he explains how his adherence to themes characteristic of the New Pragmatism (fallibilism, an emphasis on practice, historicism) all come from other sources (Popper (35), Austin (37), Foucault (38)). More so than any other writer in this collection, Hacking suggests that the New Pragmatists are perhaps aptly named in that they, unlike the Neo-Pragmatists (who typically are more explicitly committed to reviving an older pragmatist tradition), need not have any genealogical connection to the pragmatists of the past. Of course, to the extent that one thinks that convergence on a view from independent starting points is a sign of the view's truth, the fact that Hacking ends up with a version of New Pragmatism without being directly influenced by any of the classical pragmatists should be encouraging.

Arthur Fine is another example of a New Pragmatist who presents his views with an awareness of, but without demonstrating any obvious debt to, the "Old Pragmatist" tradition. His paper "Relativism, Pragmatism, and the Practice of Science" argues that much that "social constructivists" in the philosophy of science pass under the name "relativism" is little more than the sort of anti-foundationalist fallibilism familiar from most versions of pragmatism (64). Properly understood, this anti-foundationalistic 'relativism' fits better with New Pragmatist rather than Neo-Pragmatist sensibilities, and Fine suggests that readers often miss this when the unfortunate label "relativism" is used to characterize the social constructivist view.

By contrast to Hacking and Fine, Misak wears her historical debts to the classical pragmatist tradition on her sleeve, and her "Pragmatism and Deflationism" defends the superiority of Peirce's account of truth over Paul Horwich's disquotationalism and Dorothy Grover's prosententialism. Misak argues that Peirce was not in the business of giving anything like an analytic definition of truth, but was, instead, explicating its relation to our concepts of assertion and inquiry in a way that would ensure that the resulting conception of truth is naturalistically respectable (pp. 68-70). What Peirce ends up with is a conception of truth very much like Crispin Wright's notion of "superassertability"[2] according to which, if a belief is true, our attitude to it will not change no matter how much further inquiry into the topic of that belief is pursued. Truth as "indefeasible belief" best captures what is right about the "naturalist rebellion against metaphysics" (70), and allows one to endorse the claim that inquiry aims at truth. Further, this conception of truth does so without committing one to the problematic notion of a single "end of inquiry" at which every question is settled (a notion that Peirce is often (unfairly) saddled with). Of course, it is an empirical question whether or not any of our beliefs will ever be indefeasible in this way, but that such indefeasible beliefs are possible is, for Peirce, a (defeasible) presupposition of inquiry.

Unlike Wright, who takes superassertability to be one of a plurality of truth predicates, with some parts of the language supporting a truth predicate that is a little more 'inflationary',[3] Misak takes Peirce to have provided a unitary account of truth, and while different areas of discourse may be associated with beliefs that become indefeasible for different reasons, truth should be understood in terms of indefeasibility in all these areas (pp. 87-88).

This, of course, raises the question of what to say if none of our beliefs (in an area) turn out to be indefeasible in this way. Peirce would seem committed to there being no truth,[4] while Neo-Pragmatists may be inclined to argue that truth was less robust than we had initially supposed (at least about that topic). In much the same way, one might think that a range of discourse wouldn't be 'objective' for the New Pragmatist if the superassertability presupposition isn't satisfied, while the Neo-Pragmatist is willing to settle for a weaker notion of objectivity.[5] However, one needn't conclude from the fact that truth would be something less substantial if the presupposition failed, that it has to be understood that way whether or not it fails. The ultimate nature of truth (and the ultimate answer to the question of whether one should be a New Pragmatist or Neo-Pragmatist) may not be accessible a priori.

That said, there still may be issues that can be settled between the two through purely philosophical argumentation, and the tension between "Neo" and "New" Pragmatism is perhaps most explicit in Jeffrey Stout's "Our Interest in Getting Things Right: Pragmatism without Narcissism", which argues that Rorty cannot justify his recent talk about our desire to "get things right" without moving from Neo-Pragmatism to something closer to the New Pragmatist position.[6] Stout sees talk of getting things right as forcing Rorty from a position where justification is understood socially in "conformist" terms (so that whatever the community thinks is right is right) to understanding it in more Brandomian "dialogical" terms (in which it always makes sense to wonder whether anyone, including the entire community, is right) (25). However, there is a real question of whether the sort of Brandomian view that Stout endorses is really a version of New Pragmatism rather than just a very sophisticated version of Neo-Pragmatism. In particular, Brandom provides a purely 'formal' account of objectivity that would allow one to characterize a discourse about a topic as objective even if there wasn't anything like a Peircian indefeasible belief possible for the topic at hand. One might think that indefeasibility grounds a type of objectivity only if it can survive such a dialogical process, but while we can tell comparatively easily whether most of our discourse is formally objective, it is less clear that all of it is substantially so. The sorts of dialogical constraints Brandom outlines may be a necessary, but not sufficient, condition for a discourse's being truly objective.

While he doesn't put it in quite these terms, worries about whether Brandom's 'dialogical' conception of objectivity really is as robust as a New Pragmatist would like show up in Terry Pinkard's "Was Pragmatism the Successor to Idealism?", which argues that while Brandom explicitly takes his Pragmatism to be Hegelian in nature, the position is more Fichtian than Hegelian precisely because, at bottom, it doesn't get the kind of objective norms that the New Pragmatists want (164). According to Pinkard, Hegel wasn't a Neo-Pragmatist of the James/Rorty/Brandom stripe, but this leaves open the possibility that, ultimately, he can be viewed as a type of 'New' pragmatist. Indeed, he may be precisely the figure that shows us what it takes to become one.

This returns us to the issue of what to say if the sort of 'formal' dialogical objectivity that Brandom defends does not, in fact, lead to the sort of 'substantial' objectivity associated with Peircian indefeasible belief. Misak and Peirce take the line that if a 'formally' objective tract of discourse isn't also substantially objective, then the claims in it cannot be true or false, but others seem to disagree about whether truth needs to be given such a unitary account across the language. Indeed, the monism/pluralism issue about the nature of truth seems to cross-cut the New/Neo pragmatist divide.

That said, Misak is not alone in advocating a monistic account of truth. Another article in this collection that claims that pragmatism would give one a unitary treatment of truth is David Macarthur and Huw Price's dense but rewarding "Pragmatism, Quasi-realism and the Global Challenge", which argues that semantic minimalism, rather than underwriting cognitivism, actually leads to a global expressivism that they characterize as a type of pragmatism (92). The resulting position is pragmatist precisely because it follows from the sort of anti-representationalism characteristic of both pragmatism and semantic minimalism. From this perspective, the problem with a quasi-realist of Simon Blackburn's sort[7] is not his expressivism about certain parts of the language, but rather his thinking that he can remain a representationalist about the rest (pp. 103-104).

In that they put the criticism of representationalism at the center of their pragmatism, Macarthur and Price's view has some similarity to Brandom's views. Both the Rortyian 'acceptance-based' account of truth and the more Peircian super-assertability account are too substantial for their minimalist tastes, and for Macarthur and Price, pragmatism flows out of a type of global expressivism that neither Rorty (at least on their reading) nor Misak could accept.

In contrast to this sort of global pragmatism, Danielle Macbeth (in her "Pragmatism and Objective Truth") asks "whether the pragmatist maxim applies across the board to all our concepts, as pragmatists assume, or whether it applies to distinctively mathematical concepts -- that is, to mathematical concepts as they first came to be understood in the seventeenth century" (181). Unlike their ancient counterparts, modern mathematical concepts are, according to Macbeth, "wholly constituted by their inference potential" (187), and she takes the common mistake of pragmatists to be a tendency to understand all concepts on this inferential model. Still, it is these mathematical concepts, and not their "sensory" and "perspectival" (190) predecessors, that are truly objective, even if the latter sorts of concepts are, ultimately, needed to provide such concepts with "rational constraint by what is the case" (190). Mathematical concepts (which include many of the post 17th century scientific concepts) are the ones that are truly objective, but if all of our concepts were mathematical in that way, they would all suffer from a lack of objectivity of precisely the sort that the Neo-Pragmatist endorses. Indeed, Macbeth argues that a large reason why some philosophers feel the pull of Neo-Pragmatism is because they make the mistaken assumption that concepts are all mathematical.

Macbeth expresses sympathy for John McDowell's criticisms of the purely inferential approach,[8] and McDowell appears again as an example of how to move from something like Neo-Pragmatism to something more like New Pragmatism in David Bakhurst's "Pragmatism and Ethical Particularism", which focuses not on the general question of how much of the language can be understood in terms of the pragmatic conception of truth, but rather on the more specific question of what similarities and dissimilarities exist between the writings of the pragmatists, particularly Dewey, on ethics, and the views of ethical particularists such as Jonathan Dancy and McDowell. Bakhurst argues that there are many similarities between pragmatism and ethical particularism, and while James (124) and Rorty (128) are 'subjectivistic' about morals in a way that contemporary ethical particularists would find unacceptable, if interpreted charitably, Dewey can be read as more of a New Pragmatist whose resulting views are very much like those of contemporary particularists.

According to Bakhurst, "the new pragmatism is just the best of the old pragmatism, undistorted by narcissistic anthropocentrism and developed with contemporary means" (139), and this last claim could be endorsed by all of the writers in the volume. Nevertheless, I hope to have shown that there is less agreement over just what is left when the objectionable aspects of the old pragmatism are removed, but if a consensus on this is to emerge, collections like this are an invaluable step towards reaching it.



[1] The exchange between Hilary Putnam and Rorty found in Putnam's "Realism with a Human Face" (in his Realism with a Human Face, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1992) and Rorty's "Hilary Putnam and the Relativistic menace" (in his Truth and Progress, New York: Cambridge University Press, 1998) lays out this tension between Neo-Pragmatism and New Pragmatism particularly clearly.

[2] See Wright, C., Truth and Objectivity, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1992.

[3] See Wright, "Minimalism, Deflationism, Pragmatism, Pluralism" in Lynch (ed.), The Nature of Truth, Cambridge: MIT, 2001.

[4] "I do not say that it is infallibly true that there is any belief to which a person would come if he were to carry his inquiries far enough. I only say that that alone is what I call Truth. I cannot infallibly know that there is any truth" (Peirce, Charles S., Charles S. Peirce: Selected Writings, ed. Philip Weiner, New York: Dover, 1966, p. 398).

[5] For one such attempt to come up with a weaker notion, see Rorty's "Solidarity or Objectivity" in his Objectivity, Relativism and Truth, New York: Cambridge University Press, 1991.

[6] Stout has particularly in mind Rorty's reply to Ramberg in Brandom (ed.), Rorty and his Critics, Oxford: Blackwell, 2000.

[7] See, for instance, his Spreading the Word, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1984.

[8] Particularly as found in his Mind and World, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1996.