Peter Hylton


Peter Hylton, Quine, Routledge, 2007, 405pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415063982.

Reviewed by Guido Bonino, Università di Torino

Hylton's book belongs to the well-known series Arguments of the Philosophers. It fulfills the series’ aim of providing a thorough exposition of Quine's views and of the arguments supporting them. The book is probably the most comprehensive single-authored presentation of Quine's philosophy available. In fact, all of Quine's main areas of interest are adequately covered, with one notable exception, which is, however, amply justified. The exception is Quine's technical work in logic and set-theory, which is only very briefly touched on. As Hylton maintains, such a work certainly has significant connections with Quine's more general views, but a satisfactory account of it would perhaps require another book. In any case, the picture of Quine's philosophy that emerges from the book is remarkably self-contained. Furthermore, dealing adequately with the more technical issues would have yielded a wholly different book, much less accessible and so not quite in keeping with another of the series’ goals.

Hylton's pivotal interpretative thesis is that Quine -- contrary to widespread opinions -- is basically a systematic philosopher. That means, according to Hylton, that his main purpose is constructive rather than negative. The critical or negative aspects of his philosophy are probably more widely known and debated: here one thinks of Quine’s criticisms of the analytic-synthetic distinction, of modal concepts, of mentalistic entities. Yet, in Hylton's interpretation, all of these arguments, though undeniably important on their own as well as for their historical influence, are somehow subordinated, from a systematic point of view, to the constructive side of Quine's philosophy. To sum it up in a few words, Quine's constructive project amounts to an attempt to elaborate a thoroughgoing and uncompromisingly naturalistic account of both the world and our knowledge of it. Naturalism is meant as the doctrine (or perhaps the methodology) according to which reality is (to be) known and described within science, and that philosophy has no privileged vantage point distinct from that of science itself. Such a principle has many consequences, first the idea that the philosophical activity cannot but start "from the middle of things" (i.e., from within our overall system of knowledge), and second that its results are to be judged according to the same standards which are applied to science (cf. especially chapter 1, but the theme of naturalism comes up quite often throughout the whole book).

Quine’s strict adherence to naturalism leaves him with two main tasks, one epistemological the other metaphysical. This is the second important dichotomy (in addition to the previously mentioned constructive vs. negative) that governs Hylton's reconstruction of Quine's philosophy. The two dichotomies, though not coincident, are nonetheless closely associated with one another. In fact the constructive side of Quine's philosophy takes on the appearance of a "genetic project", i.e., an attempt at accounting for the formation of our knowledge without ever deviating from naturalism (and thus, it more or less corresponds to the constructive aspect). According to Quine, the fact that the naturalistic outlook of science is the best option at our disposal is itself discovered empirically by means of scientific criteria of evaluation: in fact science has given us the most comprehensive, systematic, successful and intelligible account of the world. Such a vindication of the naturalistic and scientific approach is openly circular, but that is not a weakness from Quine's perspective; it is, on the contrary, just what should be expected if one is a naturalist, since naturalism -- as has already been remarked -- does not envisage a privileged standpoint, external to the whole of knowledge, from which knowledge itself can be justified. Philosophy, which is therefore continuous with science, and adds up to its most abstract and general aspects, need not and can not look for a foundation of our knowledge (which is the task of epistemology as it is traditionally conceived), but rather should explain, in a purely scientific way, how such knowledge is attained (which is properly the task of the "naturalized epistemology" that Quine championed).

Hence the genetic project, to which Quine devoted himself mainly in the last decades of his philosophical career. This project has been regarded by some interpreters as Quine's least successful, in part because of its alleged association with outdated views such as behaviourism. Hylton takes a great deal of care in qualifying the genetic project’s contiguity with behaviourism, since from his perspective the genetic project is the crucial element of Quine's philosophy. He has two main reasons for doing so. The first reason, which is a "global" one, is that the credibility of the naturalistic outlook ultimately depends on the possibility of showing that it can account satisfactorily, at least in principle, for all the most important aspects of our knowledge. The second reason consists, in a sense, in the "local" application of the first one. When confronted with a specific problem, such as that of meaning, it is essential for the success of Quine's method to show that purely naturalistic notions can, at least in principle, do all the jobs of a putatively non-naturalistic concept such as that of meaning. That is, according to Hylton, the most important achievement by Quine with respect to the notion meaning and other analogous concepts. To be sure, Quine also put forward some major criticisms of the notion of meaning as traditionally conceived (i.e., in a mentalistic way), and such criticisms, which Hylton carefully examines, clearly belong to the negative part of his philosophy. Yet the soundness of these criticisms is somewhat secondary, since the single most decisive reason to abandon the mentalistic concept of meaning is simply that such a concept is superfluous and we can do without it. In fact the genetic project aims just at that: showing that we can account for our use and mastery of language, and for the gradual shaping of our knowledge, without resorting to the mentalistic notion of meaning. Of course, in order to do that, it suffices to find a possible way of doing away with meaning, and that explains the speculative character of many of Quine's genetic reconstructions. The same considerations put forth with regard to meaning can also be advanced in several other cases, according to Hylton. One notable example is the famous criticism of the distinction between analytic and synthetic. Whatever one may think of Quine's critical arguments against such a distinction, what really matters, in the overall economy of his philosophy, is that we can get rid of the distinction (at least as it was traditionally conceived) without great loss, i.e., we can explain the workings of our system of knowledge without drawing on it.

This interpretative stance accounts for the unusual care with which Hylton scrutinizes all the main successive steps of Quine's genetic project (cf. chapters 4-7). Some examples are the clear analysis of the distinction between "receptual" and "perceptual" similarity (pp. 117-122); the detailed examination of the concept of observation categorical, which plays a crucial role in mediating between stimulation (or neural intake) and the initial manifestations of scientific theorizing (pp. 179-189); and the ample discussion concerning the underdetermination of theories (pp. 189-196), the role of which in Quine's philosophy Hylton deliberately plays down.

The transition from epistemology to metaphysics is marked by one of the doctrines for which Quine is most famous, i.e., the indeterminacy of translation and the indeterminacy of reference. Regarding the latter, Hylton sharply distinguishes between indeterminacy of reference in a strict sense, which concerns the translation of sub-sentential parts of language, and "holophrastic" indeterminacy, which concerns the translation of whole sentences and which is, in a sense, a stronger claim. After having examined some significant objections to Quine's theses, Hylton attempts to formulate a comprehensive assessment of the extensive debate on the issue. But once again, his most original contribution lies in the appraisal of the role of the indeterminacy thesis in the context of Quine's general philosophic strategy. Hylton maintains, as in several other cases, that the truth of Quine's claim concerning indeterminacy (especially holophrastic indeterminacy) is not essential to his overall project. The claim should rather be conceived of as an empirical conjecture, albeit, in Quine's opinion, a reasonable conjecture. In other words, one could give up the indeterminacy claim and still remain a Quinean. What one cannot do is to regard indeterminacy itself as an absurd and incoherent doctrine: Hylton even holds that an appreciation of the significance and the possibility of indeterminacy is major evidence of a full understanding of Quine's naturalistic view of language (cf. p. 200). A fundamental point concerning the indeterminacy thesis is that it is mainly an ontological claim rather than an epistemological one: it is not concerned with our inability to discover which of two alternative translations is correct, but with the fact that there is nothing to be discovered at all (so that the alternative translations are, in a sense, both correct).

Chapters 9-13 are devoted to Quine's metaphysics. While the epistemological project deals with the relation of our theories and language to the world, the metaphysical one deals with the world itself, in its most general aspects. What is important to realize is that, in Quine's naturalistic framework, the two projects are strictly correlative. Epistemology investigates how we get our knowledge of the world, i.e., how we come to know the metaphysical features of reality. But among the features of reality there are also those that make our knowledge possible, or that account for the mechanisms of its acquirement: (naturalized) epistemology is not outside science (of which metaphysics is the most abstract aspect) but is part and parcel of it, i.e., it is the psychology of our cognitive processes. Among the many topics treated in these chapters are Quine's conception of logic, his endorsement of extensional languages and the parallel criticism of intensionality in all its manifestations (contexts of propositional attitudes, modality, etc.), his views on reference, and the connected criterion of ontological commitment. Of particular interest is the lucid discussion on Quine's realism (pp. 317-323), i.e., the thesis that the entities to which our best scientific theory is ontologically committed are real, in any plausible sense of the word. At first glance, it seems that some of Quine's epistemological claims, such as the underdetermination of theories or the indeterminacy of reference, could threaten this stern realism, but that conclusion relies on a misunderstanding of his naturalism. In fact, from Quine's perspective, there is no standpoint outside the scientific theories from which the reality or the existence of the entities posited by the theories themselves can be brought into question, so that any talk of reality that purports to abstract from what scientific theories tell us is bound to be nonsense.

On the whole, the relative emphasis of Hylton's book on Quine's genetic project might sound strange to ears that are perhaps more accustomed to Quine "the logician" (who is in no way neglected by Hylton). However, such emphasis -- as has been demonstrated several times -- is wholly in keeping with Hylton's chief interpretative thesis. And it is on that thesis that Hylton’s main claim to originality is based. The major achievement of his book, in addition to its being a remarkably careful and detailed presentation of Quine's views, consists precisely in his reorientation of our understanding of the overall sense of Quine's philosophical endeavour. That reorientation provides a new twist to some of the most debated Quinean issues.

I will close with a historical point. Hylton claims that, given the deep divergence between Quine's philosophical presuppositions and those of most philosophers, comparisons between Quine’s views and the views of most other philosophers would not be fruitful: they would simply amount to a "missing of minds". Maybe he is right, and in any case the choice of such an expository strategy is obviously legitimate. Yet it seems to me that Hylton’s theses would be better received if they were supported by reference to Quine's actual intellectual exchanges with his fellows. That happens when Hylton does appropriately compare Quine's views with Rudolf Carnap’s (cf. chapter 1 and part of chapter 2). Similar comparisons would have been interesting and useful, both from a theoretic and a historical point of view. Since his engagement with Carnap's doctrines were central to Quine's philosophical development, as Hylton convincingly shows, it would have been all the more stimulating to set up a comparative analysis of the different ways in which various philosophers who owed much to Carnap tried to solve similar problems. Two examples which immediately come to my mind are Wilfrid Sellars and Gustav Bergmann. This kind of analysis would perhaps contribute significantly and in an original way to a historical reconstruction of the course of American philosophy after World War II. It could also throw some light on Quine's philosophy by comparing his choices with those of other philosophers who had a similar starting point but diverging outcomes.