Propositions, by Andrea Iacona, is a very good book on the existence of propositions. It was published, in English, by the Italian publisher Name (that’s right, the name is “Name”) (www.name.it). That’s a shame, because it might mean that few readers outside of Italy will ever encounter this interesting and useful little book. I am hoping to give the book a wider exposure through this review.
Iacona (pronounced “Ya’ kona”) has basically two objectives in this book. The first is to reveal the fallacies by which others have tried to establish the existence of mind-independent propositions. The second is to offer his own deflationary account of the existence of propositions. The book is useful not only for its arguments and ideas but as also as a guide to the relevant literature (from the early 20th century up to the present).
In the first chapter, Iacona takes up several arguments for propositions that in one way or another appeal to our ordinary ways of speaking. We say that two sentences mean the same or that one sentence has two meanings and identify these meanings with propositions. We distinguish between the sentence uttered and the assertion made and explain the latter in terms of the proposition expressed. Most importantly, we characterize people’s beliefs and other attitudes using “that”-clauses that we might suppose refer to propositions. In this chapter, Iacona simply shows that we cannot derive from these observations any of a number of assumptions that are often made about propositions. In particular, we cannot conclude that propositions are language-independent, or mind-independent, or the bearers of truth, or that they have internal structure.
In the second chapter, Iacona criticizes a more metaphysical argument for propositions. The starting point for this argument is the premise that the truth of propositions is mind-independent. From this it is inferred that propositions themselves exist mind-independently. The basic mistake in this argument is the assumption that if a truth bearer is true in a world then the truth bearer exists in that world. The argument takes more subtle forms in the writings of Stephen Schiffer and George Bealer, but each of them, Iacona shows, misapplies one or another principle of logic.
Iacona does not explicitly say that he wishes to advance a deflationary theory of propositions, but that does seem to be his intention (and he does embrace the term “minimalism”, p. 68). Chapter 3 initiates this program with a deflationary account of the relation of expressing that is commonly supposed to hold between sentences and propositions. Iacona’s proposal in this regard rests on the idea that two sentences can stand in a relation of “interpretation” to one another. In terms of this relation of interpretation, an account of expression can take the form of the following schema: For every context c, the sentence s, as uttered in c, expresses the proposition p if and only if “p” is an interpretation of s as uttered in c. Notice that this does not qualify as an analysis of expression, since it is only a schema, not an actual sentence, and, due to the fact that the letter “p” occurs both in and out of quotes, it cannot readily be turned into a sentence just by binding the variables with quantifiers. Iacona does not stress this himself and so does not take up the question of exactly how a mere schema can qualify as “an account of what it is for a sentence to express a proposition” (p. 66).
As for the interpretation relation between sentences, Iacona acknowledges that there is not just one way to take this. Suppose that “He is tall” is spoken in some context in which “he” refers to John. Shall we say that “He is tall” is an interpretation of the sentence “He is tall” in the context in which “he” refers to John, so that, according to the schema, we may infer that “He is tall” in that context expresses the proposition that he is tall? Or shall we reserve the privilege of interpreting a sentence for something more like eternal sentences, such as “John Z. Ypsilanti is taller than most people alive in 2003”, in which case we should say only that “He is tall” in that context expresses the proposition that John Z. Ypsilanti is taller than most people alive in 2003? According to Iacona, we can understand interpretation in either way and so can countenance different kinds of propositions, such as indexical propositions as well as absolute propositions (p. 71).
But do propositions exist? Iacona’s answer, in the next chapter, begins with the observation that propositions might be “introduced” into our ontology via the following definitional equivalence: The proposition expressed by a = the proposition expressed by b if and only if a stands in the relation of inter-interpretability to b. The question this raises is whether the truth of the identity on the left-hand side reduces to the truth of the sentence about inter-interpretability on the right-hand side so that, despite appearances, the left-hand side does not really imply that there are propositions. The position that Iacona adopts on this question is that we can stand by the equivalence of the left-hand side and right-hand side without first deciding whether propositions exist and then can take that equivalence as grounds for asserting the existence of propositions.
In the final chapter, Iacona examines some of the more “theoretical” uses for the concept of proposition and more or less dismisses as not serious some of the questions I am going to press him on presently. But in the course of this Iacona does make at least one important observation. This is that the issue between deflationists and correspondence theorists about truth cannot be very well framed in terms of the truth of propositions. According to traditional notions of propositions, propositions have their truth values essentially. So there really can be no question of propositions being true or false according to whether or not they correspond to reality. If we want to think of propositions as the primary bearers of truth, then the issue becomes whether we should give a deflationary or a “robust” theory of the expression of propositions by sentences.
There are a couple of important motives for positing propositions to which Iacona gives too little attention. These motives do not motivate the assumption that propositions are mind-independent, which is Iacona’s primary target, but they do provide a reason for privileging a certain mode of individuating propositions, and they raise a doubt about Iacona’s strategy of introducing propositions via a relation of inter-interpretability. The motives I am thinking of stem from a common conception of linguistic communication and from a nearly universal conception of logical validity.
According to a long tradition--still very much alive in philosophy, linguistics and cognitive science--linguistic communication is a matter of a speaker’s using words to reveal to hearers the propositional content of an underlying thought. Supposedly, a speaker chooses his or her words in the expectation that on the basis of the words spoken hearers will be able to recognize that the speaker has in mind a thought with a certain propositional content. On the basis of their understanding of the language, hearers are supposed to be able to recognize that the speaker’s words express a certain proposition in the context in which they are spoken, and hearers may then typically infer that the content of the underlying thought in the speaker is that same proposition. Communication is successful if in this way the hearer is led to attribute to the speaker the attitude toward a proposition that the speaker intended the hearer to attribute to him or her.
If we are to explicate linguistic communication in this way, then it is important that we understand propositions in one particular way rather than any other. Propositions cannot be the sort of indexical propositions that Iacona mentions. A proposition cannot be what any two utterances of “I am sick” have in common regardless of who is speaking. If person A says, “I am sick”, then person B will understand what person A is saying only if B recognizes that the proposition A has in mind is a proposition that B would express by saying, referring to A, “He is sick”. B will not understand A if B attributes to A a proposition of the kind that is expressed both by A’s utterance of “I am sick” and B’s own utterance of “I am sick”. Multiplying such examples, we find that the propositions that we appeal to in this theory of linguistic communication have to be the sort of propositions that have their truth values absolutely.
In two ways this conclusion stands in conflict with Iacona’s picture. First, it complicates what we have to say about expression. Sentences may express propositions, but also propositions must somehow be borne in mind, perhaps by being “expressed” by mental representations. Second, while this conception of communication does not just deny that there are such things as indexical propositions, it does give a certain theoretical privilege to absolute propositions, which have their truth values essentially. So if we think of propositions as introduced into our ontology via the relation of inter-interpretability between sentences, we have to say what is special about the relation of inter-interpretability that introduces such absolute propositions.
Contemplation of relations of inter-interpretability leads to the second motive for propositions that Iacona basically ignores. This is that the concept of a proposition plays a special role in formal semantics and, in particular, in the definition of logical validity. It is commonly said that an argument is logically valid if and only if for every possible world w, if the premises are all true in w, then the conclusion is true in w as well. If we want to allow that the truth of a sentence is relative to a context of utterance as well as to a world, we can say that an argument is valid if and only if for every world w and every context c, if the premises are all true in c in w, then so is the conclusion. We obtain what is merely a notational variant on this definition if we assign to each sentence-context pair the set of possible worlds such that the sentence in that context is true in the worlds in that set and then say that an argument is valid if and only if for each context the intersection of the sets assigned to the premises in that context is a subset of the set assigned to the conclusion in that context. If we then dub these sets of worlds “propositions” and say that the proposition assigned to a sentence in a context is the proposition it “expresses” in that context, then we can say that an argument is valid if and only if for each context the intersection of the propositions expressed by the premises in that context is included in the proposition expressed by the conclusion in that context. In this way mere notational variation takes us from a common conception of logical validity to a conception of sentences as expressing propositions in contexts. Such propositions will be absolute propositions whose truth values depend only on whether the actual world is a member and whose truth values do not vary with context.
The fact that we have this motive for introducing absolute propositions raises the prospect that Iacona is guilty of a major begging of the question. He can acknowledge that absolute propositions are one kind of proposition that we can introduce via one kind of inter-interpretability relation. But what is this inter-interpretability relation? The only kind of inter-interpretability that he actually talks about is inter-interpretability on the basis of functional role (p. 115). But that kind of inter-interpretability is not what is wanted for purposes of introducing absolute propositions. “I am sick” may play the same functional role in me as it plays in you, and yet “I am sick” expresses a different absolute proposition when it is said by me than “I am sick” expresses when it is said by you. When we go to explicate the relation of inter-interpretability by which absolute propositions are introduced, we might find ourselves positing absolute propositions in much the same way we found ourselves doing so in defining logical validity. The kind of inter-interpretability to which we must appeal in introducing the propositions in terms of which we define logical validity will apparently be just the kind of logical equivalence that we will define in terms of that same kind of proposition.
In conclusion, one can say that Iacona has done an excellent job of isolating the issue concerning the nature and existence of propositions. One could almost just grant that he has decisively undercut the arguments for mind-independent propositions, except that until we have a fully successful alternative account of our talk of propositions we will want to leave our options open. But whether we can really accept Iacona’s deflationary account of propositions depends on whether we can have a non-question-begging account of the interpretation relation by which we introduce absolute propositions. For that, we will need an alternative conception of semantics, one that does lead us to posit absolute propositions simply by altering our notation.