2003.09.04

Richard Swinburne

The Resurrection of God Incarnate

Swinburne, Richard, The Resurrection of God Incarnate, Oxford University Press, 2003, 232pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199257469.

Reviewed by Richard Otte , University of California, Santa Cruz


In The Resurrection of God Incarnate Swinburne argues that the available evidence makes it overwhelmingly likely that Jesus was God incarnate who rose from the dead. More specifically, he argues that given our evidence, the probability that Jesus was God incarnate who rose from the dead is very high, somewhere around .97. Swinburne’s argument is based on an application of Bayes’ theorem, and most of the book is support for the probability values he uses in that theorem. What differentiates this book from other books by New Testament scholars is the emphasis that Swinburne places upon our evidence about what Jesus taught and the type of life he led; it is only in the last third of the book that we get the sort of evidence one would normally find in a book on the resurrection. In Swinburne’s Bayesian framework, evidence about how Jesus lived is very relevant to whether we should believe he rose from the dead, and Swinburne claims it is “deep irrationality” when New Testament scholars ignore this evidence in their discussions (p. 3).

In the first part of the book Swinburne discusses what sort of evidence we would expect to find if Jesus was God incarnate, and in the second and third parts of the book Swinburne argues that this is the evidence we do in fact find. It is in the final third part of the book that Swinburne focuses on the specific evidence for the resurrection. Most of the book isn’t strictly philosophical in character, and instead is an argument that we have evidence that would be likely if God became incarnate and rose from the dead. In this review I will not focus on the specific historical evidence that Swinburne presents, but instead will focus on the epistemic framework that he uses and how the historical evidence he presents fits into this framework.

Swinburne begins his argument in chapter 2 by giving three main reasons to expect God to become incarnate:

  1. to provide a means of atonement
  2. to identify with our suffering
  3. to show us how to live and encourage us to do so

From this Swinburne concludes that the probability that God will become incarnate, if he exists, is 1/2: “Again, so as not to exaggerate my case, let me suggest that these reasons make it as probable as not that, if there is a God, he will become incarnate … .” (p. 50). These reasons are not given merely to incline the reader to Swinburne’s conclusion, but also play a crucial role in his argument; they determine both the prior probability that God will become incarnate as well as what we would expect if God does become incarnate, both of which are important in Swinburne’s use of Bayes’ theorem.

However, I found it difficult to see why these reasons make it as likely as not that God would become incarnate if he exists. Swinburne himself discusses a couple of plausible alternatives to becoming incarnate as the best act for God to do, and readers may think of several more. He endorses a form of the principle of indifference applied to God’s actions, and thus one would expect Swinburne to conclude that the probability of God becoming incarnate (given that he exists) is about 1/n, where n is the number of equally best acts that God could do (p. 34). Given this, it is difficult to see why Swinburne concludes the probability of God becoming incarnate, if he exists, is 1/2 instead of 1/3, and many readers will assign an even lower probability.

In chapter 3, “The Marks of an Incarnate God,” Swinburne discusses what properties we would expect God incarnate to have. He gives five “prior requirements” for someone to be God incarnate:

live a perfect life teach great moral truths show us that he believes himself to be God incarnate teach that he provides an atonement for our sins found a church to propagate his teaching and works

But Swinburne notes that it is quite possible that a prophet satisfy these five prior requirements and still not be God incarnate, and thus Swinburne expects God to give us some further evidence that a prophet who satisfies the five prior requirements is actually God incarnate. This required additional evidence, what Swinburne calls the posterior requirement, is a “super-miracle” which clearly violates the laws of nature (p. 62).

In the rest of the book Swinburne argues that the historical evidence supports the claim that Jesus and only Jesus satisfies both the prior and posterior requirements of being God incarnate; the evidence is that Jesus lived the type of life we’d expect God incarnate to live, and the evidence also supports his being resurrected after death (a super-miracle). In part II of the book Swinburne argues that the evidence we have is not too improbable given that Jesus was God incarnate, and in part III of the book Swinburne argues that the evidence we have about the resurrection is the sort of evidence we’d expect if Jesus really did rise from the dead. So in parts II and III Swinburne has argued that the probability of the evidence we have, given that Jesus did those things, is not too low.

The basis of Swinburne’s argument is an application of Bayes’ theorem to the probability of Jesus’s being God incarnate given the evidence we have. Swinburne considers the evidence of natural theology (k) to be our background knowledge, and the evidence to be that Jesus and only Jesus satisfies the prior and posterior requirements for being God incarnate (f).1 Swinburne discusses two main interpretations of the Council of Chalcedon’s 451 A.D. affirmation that God became incarnate in Jesus. According to the “unified incarnation”, Jesus was fully aware of his divine thoughts and nature while on earth, whereas the “divided incarnation” holds that Jesus did not have full access to his divine powers, and thus was partially ignorant of his divine acts and thoughts. Since Swinburne believes the reasons to expect God to become incarnate lead us to expect a divided incarnation, he is interested in how likely it is that God became incarnate in a divided incarnation (c). More formally, Swinburne is interested in the following instance of Bayes’ theorem:

P(c/f&k) = P(f/c&k)P(c/k) ÷ [P(f/c&k)P(c/k) + P(f/~c&k)P(~c/k)]

This makes it clear that it is important to look at the probability of the evidence we have if God became incarnate, the probability of this evidence given that God did not become incarnate, and the prior probability that God will become incarnate. Swinburne’s argument depends on the evidence we have being much more likely if God became incarnate than if God did not become incarnate. For this reason the specific values that Swinburne assigns to P(f/~c&k) and P(f/c&k) are not as important to his argument as it is that P(f/~c&k) is much less than P(f/c&k).

With regard to P(f/c&k), Swinburne says “Let me not exaggerate my case and suggest (despite my strong feeling that this value should be higher) that we give it a fairly low value and put it provisionally at 1/10 ….” (p. 212). In evaluating P(f/c&k) Swinburne relies heavily on his discussion of what we would expect if God were to become incarnate (his prior and posterior requirements). But many will not be convinced by Swinburne’s claims of what to expect if God were to become incarnate. Why should we be so confident that God incarnate would teach that he was God incarnate, that he provided atonement for sins, and would rise from the dead? Based only on the evidence of natural theology, many will not find this probable at all, and will assign a lower probability to P(f/c&k).

Although Swinburne discusses P(f/c&k) at length in this book, one weakness is that he does not discuss in depth the value of P(f/~c&k). Swinburne does claim that it is “immensely unlikely” that we would have the evidence we have if God did not become incarnate: “It would have been deceptive of God to bring about this combination of evidence … unless he had become incarnate in this prophet; and so God would not have brought this about. So let’s say that P(f/~c&k) = 1/1000” (p. 213). It is clear that Swinburne’s argument is based on an appeal to God not deceiving us, which will be unconvincing to many philosophers. Certainly God allows evidence for positions inconsistent with Christianity, and this casts doubt upon the claim that God would not allow this evidence unless Jesus was God incarnate. And Swinburne gives no detailed argument that it is very unlikely we’d get this evidence if God did not exist; Swinburne simply claims that it is very unlikely that we’d get the evidence we have unless God planned it (p. 213). Given the importance of P(f/~c&k) to his argument, one would have expected a stronger defense of the claim that this is about 1/1000.

As for the prior probability of God becoming incarnate in a divided incarnation, P(c/k), many will think this much less likely than the 1/4 that Swinburne assigns to it.2 In reasoning about probability, adding more information to a hypothesis generally makes the hypothesis less likely to be true. It is a principle of probability that if A implies B, then P(A) is less than or equal to P(B). One apparent problem with Swinburne’s reasoning throughout this book is that he often appears to add information to a hypothesis by making the hypothesis more precise or detailed, without recognizing that this makes the hypothesis less probable. Swinburne began by arguing that the probability that God (assuming he exists) would become incarnate was 1/2, and he then argued that the reasons we have to expect God to become incarnate also lead us to expect a divided incarnation, which is only one of the main interpretations of what the Council of Chalcedon affirmed (p. 51-53). But given that both the divided and unified interpretations of Chalcedon are possible and have non-negligible probability, the probability of God becoming incarnate in a divided incarnation is less than the probability of God becoming incarnate (assuming the probability of God becoming incarnate with a unified incarnation is greater than 0). This makes it surprising that Swinburne assigns a probability of 1/2 to God (assuming he exists) becoming incarnate with a divided incarnation (p. 211). Given that God exists, either the probability of God becoming incarnate is greater than 1/2, the probability of a unified incarnation is 0, or the probability of a divided incarnation is less than 1/2. For this reason many will assign c a lower probability, or a range that represents ignorance. Many others will simply not be convinced by the reasons that Swinburne gives as to why God would become incarnate, and some may not even believe it is logically possible for God to become incarnate in a divided incarnation.

While reading Swinburne’s arguments, I often found myself thinking it was rational to withhold judgment on many of the probabilities he was discussing. Throughout the book Swinburne announces what he concludes from certain evidence or reasoning, but many philosophers will not be as certain of his judgments. Withholding judgment could be represented probabilistically in various ways, but the result is that it is rationally permissible to believe that the probability of the resurrection is much lower than Swinburne does.3

Swinburne claims his probabilities are to be viewed as epistemic or logical probabilities. According to Swinburne, it is a logical truth, necessarily true or necessarily false, that some evidence makes a certain proposition likely to some degree. Although it is controversial whether an adequate account of epistemic or logical probability can be developed, there must be some clear connection between rational belief and any account of epistemic or logical probability in order for the concept to be of any use. One common view is that if the epistemic or logical probability of some proposition, given all of the available relevant evidence, is r, then we should believe that proposition to degree r. Another way of putting this is that once we have taken account of all of the relevant evidence, rational degrees of belief should equal the objective probabilities; it is not rationally permissible for our degrees of belief to differ from the epistemic or logical probabilities. This principle is quite natural, and if one were to deny this principle it would be difficult to see how logical probabilities could be relevant to what it is rational to believe. This is important because throughout this book it was difficult to see why it would be irrational for someone to disagree with Swinburne on the probabilities he assigns, and to have different degrees of rational belief. Many philosophers may think it rational to withhold judgment on some of the probabilities Swinburne discusses, which allows as rational more degrees of belief than Swinburne does.

The Resurrection of God Incarnate is clearly written and Swinburne very clearly lays out the structure of his argument, something that many authors should emulate. In using a Bayesian framework to discuss evidence that is normally not thought relevant to the incarnation and resurrection, Swinburne has given an argument that those working in this area will need to take account of. However, this book will not satisfy those looking for a more philosophical work or one containing more rigorous conclusive arguments about what it is rational to believe. Swinburne’s discussion of a wider range of evidence and Bayes’ theorem does not solve these problems, but instead focuses the debate on the values of other probabilities. Since Swinburne is not successful in defending the values he assigns to various probability statements he used in Bayes’ theorem, I do not think he is successful in showing that, given our evidence, necessarily it is very likely that Jesus was God incarnate who rose from the dead; rationality appears to tolerate a wider range of belief than Swinburne acknowledges. But even if Swinburne is not successful in showing that it is overwhelmingly likely that Jesus was God incarnate who rose from the dead, he has made a good case that it is rationally permissible to hold beliefs that, by Bayes’ theorem, result in this being very probable. Thus although Swinburne may not have shown that it is rationally obligatory to believe in the incarnation and resurrection, he does give us reason to believe that one can rationally hold beliefs that imply their high probability. Another way of putting this would be to say that Swinburne’s argument is unsuccessful if dealing with logical probabilities, but we can instead interpret it as describing Swinburne’s own subjective probabilities or degrees of belief. If probability, like logic, places constraints on rational belief, Swinburne’s argument can be seen as supporting that it is epistemically permissible to believe in the resurrection of God incarnate.

Endnotes

1. The actual evidence Swinburne considers is:

f1: There is evidence (of certain strength) that prior requirements for being God incarnate is satisfied in some (unnamed) prophet. (See part 2)
f2: There is evidence (of certain strength) that the posterior requirements are satisfied by the same prophet. (See part 3)
f3: There is evidence (of certain strength) that neither set of requirements is satisfied by any other prophet (to any reasonable degree). (See chapter 3)

2. This is equal to 1/4 because the probability that God will become incarnate given that he exists is 1/2, and the probability that God exists is 1/2.

3. One common way to represent withholding judgment is with an interval , and to interpret this as saying that I don’t reject any probability value within that interval.