2008.06.32

Timothy O'Connor

Theism and Ultimate Explanation: The Necessary Shape of Contingency

Timothy O'Connor, Theism and Ultimate Explanation: The Necessary Shape of Contingency, Blackwell, 2008, 177pp., $74.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781405169691.

Reviewed by Graham Oppy, Monash University


O'Connor defends a cosmological argument from contingency for the existence of a transcendent necessary being that is the ground for an ultimate explanation of why particular contingent beings exist and undergo particular events. While O'Connor's argument has affinities with arguments defended by Aquinas, Duns Scotus, Leibniz and Samuel Clarke, among others, it nonetheless marks a highly original and extremely interesting contribution to contemporary philosophy of religion.

O'Connor divides his work into two major parts. The first major part -- "The Explanatory Role of Necessity" -- sketches some controversial ideas about the metaphysics and epistemology of necessity. The second major part -- "The Necessary Shape of Contingency" -- begins by using the ideas developed in the first part of the book to construct the promised argument for the necessary existence of a being that 'transcends the natural world and wills its acts in accordance with reason' (111). It then moves on to a defence of the claim that it is inevitable that God create at least a countable infinity of universes, and to a discussion of the implications of God's existence for conceptions of the scope of possibility and of the status of logical and mathematical necessities. Finally, the second major part of the book is a discussion of the consonance of the kind of natural theology on display in the earlier sections of the book with biblical revelation.

In the first chapter of the book -- "Modality and Explanation" -- O'Connor begins his defence of what he calls 'modal realism' by pointing out shortcomings in alternative views about the metaphysics of modality. In particular, O'Connor lodges objections against 'modal nihilism' (Quine), 'modal reductionism' (Tarski, Armstrong, Lewis), 'modal deflationism' (Rosen, Sider), 'modal conventionalism' (Sidelle) and 'modal quasi-realism' (Blackburn). As O'Connor himself notes, 'many of the critical remarks … on this or that deflationary strategy regarding modality are familiar ones, and various contemporary critics will endorse select criticisms' (30-1). However, O'Connor wants to draw the general moral that 'deflationism is a hopeless project' (31), and that we should commit ourselves to the view that the world has genuine modal structure. Even if we accept that O'Connor's criticisms of the various positions that he discusses are telling, we are only in a position to accept O'Connor's conclusion if we are convinced that 'modal realism' is not open to similarly serious objections. Otherwise, O'Connor's discussion, while sharp and interesting, would merely end up telling us what we already know, namely, that the metaphysics of modality is a very difficult topic. Moreover, we should remind ourselves that O'Connor does not attempt to provide an exhaustive inventory of logical space. For all that he actually says, there may be other views that are not subject to decisive objections, but that diverge considerably from his favoured 'modal realism'.

In the second chapter of the book -- "Modal Knowledge" -- O'Connor asks:

how do we rationally discern the possible truth of some claim that is actually false or the necessary truth of some claim that is actually true … and what, ideally, is the overall structure of our modal beliefs, and how do they inferentially connect with other beliefs? (32)

After examining -- and rejecting -- accounts of the epistemology of modality defended by Yablo and Peacocke, O'Connor sketches his preferred answers to these questions. In O'Connor's view, a properly integrated theory of modality ought to accommodate all of the following data (41):

General Level: We have a strong propensity to accept certain very general (sometimes formal) propositions and to regard them as obvious and yet transcending obvious empirical truths about the world. And our explanatory schemes appear to be built on such general propositions, so that theoretical rationality is attainable for us only if our modal notions are fundamentally legitimate.

Specific Level: The notion of necessity is bound up with our grasp of things, properties, and causation. Thus, there is no perception of the actual that is not imbued with an implicit grasp and acceptance of the modal character of reality.

Moreover, apart from accommodating this data, O'Connor claims that we also need to construct a properly integrated theory of modality that (41):

1. allows that, in ordinary contexts, people reliably track the instantiation of modal features in the world -- in a rough and ready way without attempting to develop or draw upon a theoretical perspective on modality that would enable them to correct their judgments or set them within a coherent explanatory framework;

2. explains how there can be rough yet reliable tracking of modal features at a 'commonsense' level that nonetheless is matched by systematic error at a more 'theoretical' level;

3. responds to the contention that non-accidental belief requires perception or causal contact with the facts believed, in application to both object-based ['specific'] and general modal judgments.

At the general level, O'Connor insists that 'the procedure of refinement and development of theoretical modal judgments is … one of reflective equilibrium' (43). Thus, O'Connor is a fallibilist about general level modal judgments, though he holds that there are core a priori beliefs -- 'validity of some central rules of inference … in first-order logic with identity, elementary arithmetic, and some methodological truisms guiding any form of empirical inquiry' (44) -- that we could not be led rationally to abandon. While I have some sympathy for the kind of position that O'Connor's sketches here, I think that not all of the details and arguments that he gives are correct. In particular, I think that his objection to Putnam's suggestion that surprising quantum phenomena might lead to a revision of logic isn't right. O'Connor says:

The proponent must make his case for such a revision either in classical logical terms -- reasoning classically both in showing the supposed 'incongruence' of classical logic and certain quantum phenomena and in defining the quantum logical connectives and rules of inference -- or in terms of the new logic. If the former, he hasn't really repudiated the normative status of classical reasoning. If the latter, he fails to persuade us, as pointing out that there are difficulties with our system of reasoning if one accepts another system of reasoning is necessarily underwhelming. (46)

The difficulty with this argument is that the proposed alternative to classical logic largely overlaps with classical logic: it is only a particular kind of distributive law -- and the part of classical logic from which that distributive law is derived -- that is at issue in the choice between classical logic and quantum logic. Consequently, so long as the proposed argument does not rely on principles that fall outside the common core of the two logics -- e.g., so long as the argument is classical, but makes no appeal to the disputed distributive law and the base principles from which that law is derived -- O'Connor has identified no problem with the idea that one who has hitherto accepted all of classical logic might rationally be persuaded to abandon the distributive law and at least one of the base principles on which that law depends in the light of the argument in question.

At the specific level, O'Connor claims that we are rationally required to accept -- at least tacitly -- that causal and formal necessities are primitive structural features of the world (50), that genuine properties are sparse and earn their keep by grounding objective intrinsic similarities and differences between things and conferring basic capacities to act (53), that the universally shared features of fundamental objects kinds are essential to those kinds (54), and that the acceptability of conventionalism about many or all mid-sized objects turns on the existence or non-existence of 'emergent properties' (55). Moreover, O'Connor suggests that we can tell at least the beginnings of a just-so story according to which, from the standpoint of evolutionary history, our fundamental modal convictions are appropriately connected to that which makes those fundamental modal convictions true:

An evolutionary advantage accrued to cogniser-types that readily assent to the actual truth of core logical and mathematical principles and that systematise the world in terms of natural kinds; some such cognisers in our ancestral history were selected in part owing to this fact; and the truth-makers for these actual truths are none other than their modalised counterparts. (59)

However, those who think that this just-so story beginning does not have even prima facie appeal would do well to note that O'Connor also goes on to claim that:

It is open to the theist … to suppose that it is a divine intention that human cognitive abilities are disposed to modalise reliably in accordance with modal fact. In this way, there can be a tie between modal fact and human modal judgments that plausibly accords with the proper function of human cognition while preserving the integrity of the purely natural causal processes generating such judgments. Our typical naturalist will be scandalised at this Leibnizian solution, but can he do any better? (129)

It seems to me that 'our typical naturalist' has grounds to feel 'scandalised' at this latter proposal. Theists ought not to reject the assumption that the divine intention in question has an 'evolutionary' implementation. But, given that there is an 'evolutionary' account of the development of our disposition to modalise reliably in accordance with modal fact, then, from the standpoint of naturalists, the postulation of the alleged divine intention is just a fifth wheel to the coach. (For hints at the beginnings of a just-so story that has rather more prima facie appeal than the story beginning that O'Connor offers, I recommend Steven Pinker's The Stuff of Thought, Allen Lane, 2007. It seems to me to be pretty plausible to think that a satisfying just-so story will involve both biological evolution and cultural 'evolution'.)

O'Connor rounds out the second chapter of the book with a defence of the idea that there is only one kind of alethic possibility -- absolute or metaphysical possibility -- which is subject to a nested series of increasingly demanding theoretical constraints: formal or logical consistency, conceptual consistency, consistency with kind-constitution identities, consistency with individual essence, and consistency with property dispositional identities (60). From the text, it seems that O'Connor wishes to deny that there is a genuine distinction between causal possibility -- consistency with the causal and structural laws of the actual world -- and some more permissive kind of possibility which merely requires consistency with alternative (non-actual) systems of causal and structural laws. Whether this denial is plausible turns, at least in part, on whether we are supposed to think that the laws of physics, and the equations the define 'boundary conditions' for the actual world belong to the class of causal and structural laws. (If the gravitational constant were much weaker, but everything else remained the same, would that count as a change to 'the causal and structural laws of the actual world'? At best, I missed the part of O'Connor's text that provides an answer to this question.)

In the third chapter of the book -- "Ultimate Explanation and Necessary Being: The Existence Stage of the Cosmological Argument" -- O'Connor sets out his case for the existence of a necessary being that is the ground for an ultimate explanation of why particular contingent beings exist and undergo particular events. The case presented in this chapter has three main parts. First, O'Connor addresses concerns about the coherence or explanatory potential of the notion of a necessarily existent being. Second, O'Connor responds to alternative theories which reject the assumption that there is a necessary being that is the ground for an ultimate explanation of why particular contingent beings exist and undergo particular events. Third, O'Connor sets out a theory of intentional explanation that is intended to explain how it is possible for a necessarily existent agent to be the ultimate explanation of why particular contingent beings exist and undergo particular events.

O'Connor begins the chapter with the claim that the 'trend towards a deflationary view of modality has wide implications, affecting the central aim of metaphysics' (65). On O'Connor's account, that central aim has been:

to articulate a theoretical framework that make possible ultimate explanation of reality -- that is, a natural or non-arbitrary stopping point … to the nested series of available plausible explanations for increasingly general aspects of the world. (65)

Moreover, according to O'Connor, the realisation of this aim has been taken to require an answer to the fundamental existence question: why do the particular contingent objects there are exist and undergo the events that they do? But, on O'Connor's view, the trend towards a deflationary view of modality has led to the widespread view that the existence question is 'unanswerable' (66).

I think that it is pretty implausible to claim that there is a widespread view that the existence question is 'unanswerable', much less that there is a widespread view of this kind that depends upon the trend towards 'deflationary views of modality'. Even the most casual reflection suggests that there are three 'schemes' that might be adopted by naturalistic philosophers: infinite regress, brute origin and necessary non-agential origin. Each of these 'schemes' involves an answer to the existence question, and suggests a 'natural or non-arbitrary stopping point for explanation'. Moreover, each of these schemes is available to naturalistic philosophers, including at least some of those naturalistic philosophers who adopt a deflationary view of modality. Since the central aim of metaphysics is to choose between 'schemes' such as these on grounds of theoretical virtue -- fit with evidence, simplicity, explanatory scope, explanatory power, consonance with best science, consonance with Moorean fact, and the like -- naturalists who properly choose a 'scheme' or who are properly undecided between a range of 'schemes' do have an answer to the existence question. True enough, O'Connor insists that those who opt for 'brute origin' suppose that the existence question is unanswerable: but this insistence is merely the reflection of an unjustified piece of linguistic imperialism.

O'Connor's objection to 'infinite regress' turns on his claim that this 'scheme' is committed to the proposition that 'immanent, stepwise … explanation can be complete … even when the explanandum is a single event of short duration' (74). This claim seems to me to be clearly mistaken: the proponent of 'infinite regress' thinks that a chain of 'immanent, stepwise explanation' can be complete only in the case in which the chain regresses infinitely. Moreover, the proponent of 'infinite regress' also thinks that a chain of 'immanent, stepwise explanation' can be complete only in cases in which it is impossible for there to be anything that precedes all of the elements in the chain. (That the proponent of 'infinite regress' should make this second claim is one of the lessons of Alex Pruss's cannonball example, cited by O'Connor in support of his claim that 'infinite regress' is essentially explanatorily incomplete (75).) O'Connor notes that others have objected to 'infinite regress' on the grounds that it cannot give a complete contrastive explanation -- why a universe with an infinite regress with this particular character rather than that? But, since his own preferred complete explanation is non-contrastive, he acknowledges that this criticism is not available to him. I take it that, at least for all that O'Connor argues, 'infinite regress' remains a live option. Moreover, I hold that there is strong theoretical reason to maintain that, if there is an infinite regress of contingent things, then naturalism trumps theism (since the extra ontology and ideology of theism buys no increase in explanatory power in this case).

O'Connor's preferred 'scheme' involves a necessarily existing being that brings the universe into existence by directly generating an intention whose content is that the universe obtain, in order to satisfy some essential purpose of the being, guided by the being's essential recognition that creating the universe would satisfy that purpose. The key feature of O'Connor's account is that the being will essentially have many purposes, and, for each of those purposes, will essentially recognise many different ways of satisfying those purposes. However, there is nothing further that explains why the being acts on the purpose that it does, or why it chooses to satisfy the purpose that it does in the way that it does: on the contrary 'the intention is irreducibly a product of the agent qua agent' (82). While it is clear that O'Connor's 'scheme' does not afford a complete contrastive explanation, O'Connor suggests that to object to his 'scheme' on this ground merely makes the improper demand that a complete explanation has to 'render the actual state of affairs inevitable'. In particular, says O'Connor, where there is objective chance, it is sufficient for complete explanation merely to 'point to the causal mechanism (however chancy)' that produced a given event.

I agree with O'Connor that, where there is objective chance, we are satisfied with an explanation that points to causal mechanism. However, this is true only where there is objective chance -- i.e. where there is a probability distribution over a set of possible outcomes. If O'Connor supposes that there is a probability distribution over a set of possible intentions for his necessarily existing being then, fine, we have a 'scheme' to set against infinite regress, brute origin and necessary non-agential origin. However, when we set the theoretical costs of O'Connor's scheme against the benefits -- how natural or non-arbitrary is it for explanation to come to a halt with a probability distribution over a set of possible intentions in a necessarily existing agent? -- then it seems to me that naturalists are pretty well-placed to insist that each of infinite regress, brute origin and necessary non-agential origin does better. On the other hand, if O'Connor supposes that there is no probability distribution, then naturalists can quite properly object that he loses any entitlement to the claim that the agent produces the intentions (or that the agent has control over the intentions, etc.). Talk about 'production', 'control', and so forth is empty unless there is counterfactual (causal, nomic) dependence, or probabilistic dependence, or both. Taking this route, O'Connor hasn't even set out a 'scheme' that merits comparison with the various naturalistic alternatives.

I have not discussed O'Connor's defences of the claim that there are contingent beings, that the concept of necessary being is not incoherent, and that the invocation of necessary being has genuine explanatory potential. While other naturalists may wish to contest these parts of O'Connor's case, I think that the foregoing considerations establish that naturalists can make a good argument for the conclusion that, even if we concede to O'Connor everything that he wants on these other matters, it is still the case that he doesn't have a cogent argument for the existence of a necessary being that is the ground for an ultimate explanation of why particular contingent beings exist and undergo particular events.

In the fourth chapter of the book -- "The Identification Stage" -- O'Connor sets out his case for holding that the necessary being, whose existence is taken to have been established in the third chapter of the book, is a transcendent, personal creator of all contingent things. This case has three main parts. First, O'Connor argues against the suggestion that the universe is necessarily existent. Second, O'Connor distinguishes between two different models of 'transcendent necessary being': an impersonal 'mechanistic' model (Chaos) and a personal, agential model (Logos). Third, O'Connor argues that, while the data concerning the fine-tuning of our universe for life does not support an independent argument for the existence of God, that data does support selection of the Logos model over the Chaos model.

O'Connor's objection to the suggestion that the universe is necessarily existent turns on traditional considerations about the necessary 'intimate internal connectedness' (88) of the essence of the postulated necessary being. Given that the universe has 'enormous mereological complexity' (90), it simply cannot be identified with the necessary being whose existence is supposed to have been established by the existence stage of O'Connor's argument. O'Connor himself admits that his argument at this point is 'a rather hard-scrabble metaphysical excursion' (xii), and I suspect that many who are not hostile to some kind of 'modal realism' will nonetheless think that O'Connor's argument is unpersuasive. However, even naturalists who do find O'Connor's argument persuasive need not give up on necessary non-agential origin at this point: for such naturalists might well suppose that it is far more plausible to think that the universe has a necessarily existent simple initial state -- i.e. a necessarily existent initial state in which there is no mereological complexity -- than it is to suppose that there is a necessarily existent agent that has no mereological complexity and that functions as a transcendent cause of the existence of the universe. When O'Connor focuses his discussion on the claim that 'the universe itself, in all its totality, is necessary being', he just takes aim at the wrong target.

O'Connor prefers Logos to Chaos on the grounds that universes fine-tuned for life are more likely on the Logos hypothesis than on the Chaos hypothesis. This preference depends upon assumptions about the range of possible universes, and about the kinds of universes that a necessarily existent agent would favour. Moreover, this preference should be assessed in the context of O'Connor's further view that it is inevitable that the postulated necessarily existent agent will create at least a countable infinity of universes (120). Unless O'Connor supposes that there is some good sense in which universes that are fine-tuned for life are more common in the range of universes that the necessarily existent being makes than in the range of universes over which a random mechanism makes selection, it seems that he is no position to claim that the fine-tuning of our universe is evidence in favour of Logos over Chaos. But why should we suppose that this is the case? Even if we suppose that it is plausible that a necessarily existent agent would want to include fine-tuned universes like ours amongst the worlds that it makes, what reason do we have for supposing that the necessarily existent agent will have a particular fondness for universes that are fine-tuned for life in the way that our universe is fine-tuned for life? Given how little we know about possible life-supporting universes, it is hard to see how to form any kind of judgment about the claim that the necessarily existing agent would have a very strong preference for universes in which fine-tuning for life is not required. Yet, if there were some good sense in which universes that are fine-tuned for life are very rare in the range of universes that a necessarily existent being would make, then it could even turn out that the fine-tuning data supports Chaos over Logos!

O'Connor's discussion of 'the fine-tuning argument' (97-108) is very interesting. Here, I will just register a worry about one part of his discussion. In response to the observation that it is impossible to assign a uniform probability measure across an infinite interval, O'Connor says that, while this is an unassailable point, it is doubtful that it shows that the inference from fine-tuning is baseless. For, 'as is well known, similar objections can be made to forms of reasoning structurally analogous to the argument from fine-tuning that it would be folly to dismiss' (103). As an example of such reasoning, O'Connor suggests reasoning concerning a fair lottery in which there are infinitely many tickets. While O'Connor thinks that it is perfectly proper to infer that, in such a lottery, each ticket is such that it is 'effectively certain' that it won't win, it seems to me that we ought rather to hold that it is impossible that there be a fair lottery in which there are infinitely many tickets. Pace O'Connor, not even God could administer an infinite lottery in which, for each ticket, it is 'effectively certain' that that ticket will not win, and yet it is certain that one ticket will win. But, if this is right, then the defender of 'the fine-tuning argument' has more work to do in order to accommodate the observation that it is impossible to assign a uniform probability measure across an infinite interval. (I don't say that this work can't be done; the only point that I'm registering here is that O'Connor's response to this observation is inadequate.)

In the fifth chapter of the book -- "The Scope of Contingency" -- O'Connor argues for the claim that it is inevitable that the postulated necessarily existent agent will create at least a countable infinity of universes, and then moves on to a discussion of various loose ends left by the discussion in the book to this point. I shall just discuss what O'Connor has to say about two of these loose ends here.

First, under the heading 'Perfection and Freedom', O'Connor observes that it is 'plausible' to hold that:

The core metaphysical feature of freedom is being the ultimate source, or originator, of one's choices, and that being able to do otherwise is for us closely connected to this feature … . Only by there being less than deterministic connections between external influences and choices … is it possible for me to be an ultimate source of my activity, concerning which I may truly say 'The buck stops here'. (121)

I have already noted that I think that what O'Connor here finds 'plausible' is actually false. If I'm to be the originator of my choices, then I must have features that can be invoked in explanations -- causal or probabilistic -- of my making those choices. Moreover, the ultimate explanation of my possession of the features that I have that can be invoked in explanations of this kind must advert to what O'Connor calls 'external factors'.

Second, under the heading 'Some Applications of the Many-Universe-Creation Hypothesis', O'Connor claims that, on plausible assumptions:

God will in fact have compelling reasons to create a universe in which significant suffering is permitted to occur even if the goods that require suffering are not the greatest goods, or if the universe in which they occur does not belong to a class of supremely valuable realms. All that is required is that the suffering-risking universes satisfy a minimum threshold of goodness.

On the basis of this observation, O'Connor claims that his view has an advantage over 'one-universe theism' at this point, since it can get by with weaker assumptions in responding to 'the problem of evil': for, unlike the 'one-universe theist', O'Connor needn't suppose that the goods that require suffering are the greatest goods, or that our universe belongs to the class of supremely valuable realms. While this claim seems right, it is perhaps worth pointing out that O'Connor's theory clearly doesn't help to overturn the thought that a morally perfect being would not permit a person to suffer horrendously unless it was in the interests of that very person to undergo the horrendous suffering in question. Appearances generated by O'Connor's discussion of the value of universes to the contrary, considerations about minimum thresholds of goodness in suffering-risking universes cannot float free of these kinds of deontological concerns (or so it seems to me).

In the sixth and final chapter of the book -- "The God of Abraham, Isaac and Anselm?" -- O'Connor takes on two argumentative tasks. First, he argues that, while his favoured style of natural theology does commit him to much of the medieval theological conception of God, it does not commit him to the parts of that conception that many contemporary theologians find most problematic: for instance, it does not commit him to the claim that God is immutable, impassable, and atemporal. Second, O'Connor argues that 'the ordinary religious theist' cannot 'stably' believe that, while God is causally immune from destruction, God is not an absolutely necessary being. I shall only discuss the second of these arguments here. (Much of the first argument is concerned with a critique of Molinism that I am happy to commend (135-38).)

O'Connor begins his case against a contingently existing God by offering the following argument:

If God is not a necessary being, if He might not have existed, then it is possible that there is a being which neither owes its existence to Him nor derives power from Him. From this it follows that, possibly, there is a being over which God has no causal control. But if this last is so, then whether our world, the actual world, contains such a being (or indeed, an arbitrary plurality of such beings) is an entirely contingent fact, and more particularly, one whose obtaining God has not controlled. And this would seem to call into question God's sovereignty on even a hazy, untheoretical grasp of this notion, let alone strict omnipotence. (141)

I think that this argument is not very persuasive. Even if we suppose that God is not a necessarily existent being, we can still suppose that God is essentially sovereign: in every possible world in which God exists, God has control over everything else that exists. So, beings that exist without owing their existence to God and without deriving their power from God, cannot exist in worlds in which God exists. If that's right, then someone who thinks that God only exists contingently should not allow O'Connor his first premise: what is true is only that, if God might not have existed, then there might have been a being which neither owes its existence to Him nor derives power from Him. But, from the fact that, if God might not have existed, then there might have been a being which neither owes its existence to Him nor derives power from Him, it plainly does not follow that it might have been the case that God co-existed with such a being and had no control over that being.

Against what is effectively this objection to his initial argument, O'Connor offers the following buttressing consideration:

Once you give up the assumption … that the existence of anything requires an explanation, as a matter of metaphysical necessity, there is no principled basis for maintaining that in those possible worlds … in which God exists there must always be an explanation for every existing thing, in terms of God's power … . The de-Hellenizing objector has conceded that, as a general matter, there could have been objects other than God who do not owe their existence to anything, who just 'happen' to exist. So how could it be that God's nature nonetheless prevents them from inconveniently appearing in His own backyard, so to speak, that is, in a world in which He does exist? It is as if the objector were positing a divine modal force field, that keeps away uncaused occurrences that are otherwise perfectly possible. To borrow a phrase from Leibniz, it is a mythology somewhat ill conceived. (142-3)

I don't think that this buttressing consideration is effective either. It seems to me to be plausible to think that we can distinguish all possibilia into two classes: those that are capable of lonely existence, and those that are not. Things that are capable of lonely existence are things that could be the only thing that exists. Someone who thinks that God exists only contingently thinks that God is not the only possibilia that is capable of lonely existence: perhaps, for example, such a person thinks that certain kinds of natural universes are also capable of lonely existence. It also seems to me to be plausible to think that many possibilia that are not capable of lonely existence have co-existence conditions, i.e. conditions that govern the objects with which they can and cannot co-exist. So, for example, possibilia that are essentially spatio-temporal cannot exist unless there is a spatio-temporal framework within which they occupy a location; and possibilia that are essentially uncaused cannot exist in a universe that is essentially a causal plenum (even though it can be that such a universe itself has no cause of its existence). Rather than 'positing a divine modal force field', O'Connor's objector need only be evincing a distinct commitment to 'external relations of necessity that are opaque to our cognitive capacities' (67) -- or so, at any rate, it seems to me to be plausible to suggest.

Having completed this overview of O'Connor's text, I'll conclude with some remarks about one difficulty that I find for the overall position that O'Connor defends. The difficulty arises as a tension between the following claims that O'Connor makes:

1. There is a sharp distinction between concepts and properties. Concepts can be as useless as you please for explanatory purposes, whereas properties are sparse and earn their explanatory keep: they ground objective, intrinsic similarity and difference, and they confer basic capacities to act. (53)

2. There is an intimate internal connectedness -- 'short of identity' but perhaps reaching as far as 'entailment' -- between God's properties (or, at any rate, between God's essential properties). (88)

3. We can give an ultimate explanation of the existence of the universe by appealing to the agency of God, and, in particular, to God's generation of creative intentions. (83)

4. We can properly and fully explain the behaviour of human beings by appealing to their agency and their generation of intentions. (80)

From 2, it would seem to follow that there can be no properties that are common between God and human beings. After all, it is uncontroversial that human beings are not omnipotent, or omniscient, or perfectly good -- whence, if there is an intimate internal connectedness between God's properties, it surely does follow that there are no human beings that have any of the properties that God possesses. Of course, that's not to say that there cannot be concepts that apply both to God and to human beings: the doctrine espoused in 2 is silent on this question, but, independently, it is just obvious that, say, the concept of being self-identical applies in both cases.

From 3, however, it seems to follow that being an agent and generating creative intentions are properties of God: else, surely we would need to take back the suggestion that we can give an ultimate explanation of the existence of the universe by adverting to God's agency and God's generation of creative intentions. From 1, it seems that we ought to be able to infer that if being an agent and generating creative intentions really do earn their explanatory keep in an ultimate explanation of the existence of the universe, then they really are properties. And, in any case, O'Connor says quite explicitly that he takes agency and generation of creative intentions to be essential properties of the necessary being that is responsible for the existence of the universe.

But, from 4, it is clear that O'Connor supposes that being an agent and generating intentions -- including generating creative intentions -- are properties of human beings. So, as I said, there is a clear tension -- if not an outright contradiction -- in the set of doctrines that O'Connor defends across the course of his book. Of course, the tradition in which O'Connor situates his work was not blind to this kind of difficulty: Aquinas, for example, spills much ink discussing the ways in which our terms are and are not properly predicated of God. However, it seems to me that naturalists are perfectly entitled to conclude, on these grounds alone, that O'Connor hasn't yet managed to produce a 'scheme' that is a credible competitor to naturalism.

Of course -- setting aside the worry just now elaborated -- I also think that my earlier discussion shows that naturalists can plausibly argue that, while they may be unsure which of infinite regress, brute origin and necessary non-agential origin is true, each of these 'schemes' trumps O'Connor's theism, whence it follows that O'Connor plainly provides no reason why naturalists should not persist in their naturalism. More carefully: if there is an infinite regress of contingency, then the 'scheme' infinite regress is preferable to theism, on grounds of overall theoretical virtue, giving appropriate weighting to fit with evidence, simplicity, explanatory scope, explanatory power, consonance with best science, consonance with Moorean fact, and the like. Else, both brute origin and necessary non-agential origin are preferable to theism, again on grounds of overall theoretical virtue. Or so naturalists can reasonably contend.