Giorgio Agamben


Giorgio Agamben, Profanations, Jeff Fort (tr.), Zone Books, 2007, 99pp., $25.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781890951825.

Reviewed by Jeffery Geller, University of North Carolina, Pembroke

The book contains ten essays on a variety of subjects, written by a leading contemporary political philosopher. The key essay contends that the apparatus of "fulfilled capitalism" severely restricts the prospects for human fulfillment and suggests a practical solution.

Currently a professor of aesthetics in Venice, Agamben is equally competent in a number of fields, including political theory, ethics, law, history, literary theory, film studies, and religious studies. While such broad expertise is a valuable resource, it places extraordinary demands on readers. There is a powerful temptation to simplify his thought. Unfortunately, the simplified version is also extremely attractive, though for the wrong reasons. In caricatured form, his arguments appear to be based on a false premise, indeed a premise motivated by widely shared delusions. To judge for themselves whether Profanations is worth the effort, prospective readers should know something about its odd structure, about the difficulties readers face as they follow Agamben from one subject to another, and about the philosophical background that informs his thought.

While few of Agamben's books fall neatly into a disciplinary niche, Profanations is a collage of boundary crossings. The ten chapters, which vary in length from barely one page (Chapters Six and Ten) to twenty pages (Chapter Nine), contain an analysis of magic, happiness, and worthiness (19-27), an analysis of parody, fiction, and metaphysics (37-51), a critique of Foucault's aporia on the subject of authorship (61-72), and a detailed explication of the term 'species' and its political implications (58-59), to mention only a few of the many themes addressed. As a result of Agamben's dynamic and deliberately playful shifting from one mode of discourse to another, readers might find it difficult to get their bearings. Just as they are on the verge of figuring out what is going on, something new comes along that re-mystifies the text. For example, at the end of Chapter Eight, "The Author as Gesture," the penultimate sentence reads as follows:

A subjectivity is produced where the living being, encountering language and putting itself into play in language without reserve, exhibits in a gesture the impossibility of its being reduced to this gesture (72).

Since this fits into the previous discussion, it makes perfect sense in context. By contrast, the final sentence of the chapter seems to come out of nowhere:

All the rest is psychology, and nowhere in psychology do we encounter anything like an ethical subject, a form of life (72).

Whether or not the last sentence is true, and it is on its face at least debatable, it does not follow from the preceding discussion. It sits at the end of the paragraph, at the end of the chapter, as an appendage, perhaps a warning that leads readers to wonder whether their confidence that they have understood what came before was an illusion.

As though the frequent passages between disciplinary fields were not enough to keep the reader off balance, Profanations also has a autobiographical dimension. It may be read as a series of prose snapshots of the author, whose celebrity status has generated interest in him personally. Seen in this light, it is like an album divided into ten sections that give impressions of the author in different poses, some candid and intimate, others veiled by more standard rhetoric. An example of the former is Chapter Three, the only chapter written in the first person, which begins with the question "What fascinates and entrances me in the photographs I love?" (23). Other chapters are written in the style of highly theoretical discourse, as illustrated by the following passage from Chapter One:

We must therefore consider the subject as a force field of tension whose antithetical poles are Genius and Ego. This field is traversed by two conjoined but opposed forces: one that moves from the individual to the impersonal and another that moves from the impersonal to the individual (13).

In contrast to the confessional tone of Chapter Three, the other chapters are less personal. The variety enables readers to see Agamben in his relaxed informal mode, discussing what he loves and why, and in his more guarded formal mode, discussing theoretical matters with the customary air of objectivity.

Though any book can be read in multiple ways, Profanations is particularly adaptable to the interests of the reader. It might be reviewed, therefore, in a number of ways, for example, as a work of literature, a collection of prose poems, a portrait of the author, a diagnosis of the current political scene, or as a prophetic warning. In terms of its philosophical content, which is probably of greatest interest to readers of NDPR, the book is difficult, despite its brevity and apparent light-heartedness. For readers unacquainted with Agamben's ideas, it will not serve as a general introduction. It might very well, however, stimulate those who have heard the buzz about him to read his earlier books. Profanations represents a new move in a vibrant career and will be welcomed by readers who have followed the arguments he has developed over the last three decades.

At the risk of oversimplifying a complex body of ideas, I will place Profanations in the context of at least a fraction of Agamben's thought. A fraction is all that can be expected here, principally because I cannot hope to duplicate the range of expertise Agamben commands. In the single short volume of Profanations, he builds on insights from a kaleidoscopic range of philosophers, including Aristotle, Kant, Marx, Nietzsche, Schmitt, Heidegger, Adorno, Benjamin, and Foucault, among many others, not to mention an equally wide range of figures from art and literature. The climactic essay "In Praise of Profanation" ties the collection together by explaining the apparatus of commodification. While that essay draws most extensively from Walter Benjamin, whose influence has been evident throughout Agamben's career, readers will also find it helpful to think of Theodor Adorno in the background.

In earlier works, notably, Homo Sacer: Sovereign Power and Bare Life (one of three books in the Homo Sacer series), Agamben developed the unsettling thesis that everyone subject to the sovereign authority of the modern nation-state has been reduced by a system of biopolitics to naked life, existence devoid of personal dignity and rights. In this reduced state, people are not legally or morally protected against mistreatment at the hands of the sovereign. Reduction to the naked life is not restricted to a small minority, according to Agamben, but is virtually pervasive. The biopolitics responsible for Nazi concentration camps are on display in the general tendency of the modern nation-state to suspend the rights of citizens in cases of exception, that is, cases of national emergency, as illustrated in the United States, he has argued, by the USA Patriot Act and the power assigned to the Homeland Security Administration. Following Benjamin, Agamben contends that the modern nation-state careens from one national emergency to the next and weaves these emergencies seamlessly into one long state of exception. Whereas the power of the nation-state vis-à-vis the power of its citizens is expressly circumscribed, for example, by the Bill of Rights in the U.S. Constitution, the state of exception legally empowers the sovereign to expand its own power and to suspend individuals' rights. The state of exception, according to Carl Schmitt, authorizes the sovereign to detain and kill its subjects in the interest of maintaining the nation-state. Drawing from and expanding on Benjamin and Schmitt, Agamben argues that such authority strips citizens of their rights and leads to the formation of naked life.

The volume currently under review begins and ends (though there is a very short essay entitled "The Six Most Beautiful Minutes in the History of Cinema" (93-4) that follows almost as a postlude) with essays that address the notion of personal identity. The opening essay (9-18) suggests that the source of human creativity is impersonal. Contrary to the popular notion that creativity can be ascribed to individuals, a notion that finds its most convincing support in Hannah Arendt's theory of natality, Agamben contends that genius is better understood as an impersonal force beyond the ego, something like the muses of ancient mythology. This engaging essay provides some of the groundwork for Agamben's strategy for combating the apparatus of fulfilled capitalism.

Chapter Nine (73-92) investigates subjectivity in the context of oppression. Here Agamben argues that people who belong to the religious cult of capitalism sacrifice every facet of life and end up in a supremely frustrating environment where everything is sacred, hence off limits to personal use. The practice of sacrifice transforms the status of things from objects of desire and use to elements of an apparatus, namely the apparatus of universal commodification and consumption. Sacrifice displaces something from the domain of human use to the domain of exclusively divine use, thus making it sacred. In this case, the divine is capital and the sacred is anything required by the apparatus of capitalism. On these issues, readers will find resonances with Max Weber and Theodor Adorno as well as Walter Benjamin.

Profanation, the opposite of and antidote to sacrifice, is the process whereby what was previously given up is restored for our use and enjoyment. The sanctity of the sacred renders unprofanable that which, according to Agamben, is most in need of profanation. Thus the religious cult of capitalism is doubly protected, first, by a system that absorbs personal desire into an apparatus of consumption and, second, by an imperative that appears tautological: treat the sacred as sacred. Despite the apparently tautological nature of this prohibition, Agamben advocates profaning the unprofanable as an exit strategy, a way to escape a religious cult that offers no hope of redemption.

Profanations contains developed arguments, suggestions for looking at things differently, critical readings of others' ideas, and a host of personal perceptions, reactions, and reflections. What they have in common is that they are all provocations of one sort or another that perform what the essay "In Praise of Profanation" describes and theorizes. Each essay exhibits the spontaneity of Genius that leads away from an ethos of ascetic sacrifice and joyless consumption. Agamben's profanations, like Adorno's avant-garde works of art, are intended as modes of resisting the universal absorption into capitalist production and consumption. In Adorno's terms, both he and Agamben attempt to counteract the positive dialectic of universal commodification by setting in motion a negative dialectic that resists inclusion in the capitalist apparatus.

There is little doubt that this exposé of the moral, political, economic, and religious bankruptcy of modernity has its charm, as attested by Agamben's popularity. So, from a critical philosophical perspective, what are we to make of Profanations? To evaluate a book generally requires that it be compared to its peers, to other books of more or less the same genre. In this case, however, it is difficult to find an appropriate peer group, at least partly because its author, whose animus against assimilation to species is expressly stated (in Chapter Seven), produced a work that defies classification.

One thing that can be said, regardless of what genre the book belongs to, is that each of its parts is playful and engaging, which accords with the thesis that it is indeed a collection of profanations. As a whole, however, it is quite serious. Viewed as an argument, indeed as a continuation of an argument already in progress, it is a distillation of a jeremiad so complete in its condemnation of modernity that all we have to look forward to is a messianic end of time and a new beginning that starts virtually from scratch. Consider, for example, the following passage:

We could say that capitalism, in pushing to the extreme a tendency already present in Christianity, generalizes in every domain the structure of separation that defines religion. Where sacrifice once marked the passage from the profane to the sacred and from the sacred to the profane, there is now a single, multiform, ceaseless process of separation that assails every thing, every place, every human activity in order to divide it from itself. This process is entirely indifferent to the caesura between sacred and profane, between divine and human. In its extreme form, the capitalist religion realizes the pure form of separation, to the point that there is nothing left to separate … . In the commodity, separation inheres in the very form of the object, which splits into use-value and exchange-value and is transformed into an ungraspable fetish. The same is true for everything that is done, produced, or experienced -- even the human body, even sexuality, even language (81).

Passages like this vindicate a reading that sees capitalism, along with the modern nation-state it accompanies, as beyond redemption.

At this point, Profanations brings us to a crossroads. Is it to be taken as an attempt to depict the way things actually are or as a warning, in the Orwellian spirit, against allowing certain trends to go too far? Only the second option, I would argue, does justice to the subtlety of Agamben's thought. A productive way to read him is as a prophet, in the tradition of the Old Testament, a relentless social critic whose obsessive focus on corruption prevents that very corruption from being actualized. Agamben comes across this way in many passages. For example, the aforementioned explication of 'species', which begins with his trademark etymological treatment of the term, moves finally into full-blown normative discourse:

Everywhere the special must be reduced to the personal and the personal to the substantial. The transformation of the species into a principle of identity and classification is the original sin of our culture, its most implacable apparatus. Something is personalized -- is referred to as an identity -- at the cost of sacrificing its specialness (59).

As categorical as his judgments appear to be about the current condition of our "species," he always offers a way out, hence the value of the normative discourse.

The appeal of Profanations is that it suggests a solution to one of the central problems of our time: the hypocritical affirmation of human dignity and rights in a political, economic, and religious climate that reduces people to naked life. Whereas it is an open question whether human dignity and rights are as beleaguered as Agamben makes them appear, his strong, perhaps hyperbolic, rhetoric gives emphatic expression to the need for continued vigilance. How readers interpret Profanations and whether they agree with it under any interpretation are up to them. It is in any event worth reading.