2008.07.03

Alvin Plantinga, Michael Tooley

Knowledge of God

Alvin Plantinga and Michael Tooley, Knowledge of God, Blackwell Publishing, 2008, 270pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780631193647.

Reviewed by William L. Rowe, Purdue University


The first two chapters -- Plantinga's "Against Naturalism" and Tooley's "Does God Exist?" -- make clear the central issues in the debate between these two distinguished philosophers. Plantinga provides an account of how faith, "belief in the central features of the Christian message", can be knowledge. For if the belief-producing process includes the activity of the Holy Spirit, and works the way it was designed, "according to a design plan successfully aimed at truth", then "if it is held with sufficient firmness (and assuming that it is true), it will constitute knowledge" (p. 12). He rejects naturalism since it cannot accommodate the idea of proper function "for such organisms as plants and animals and human beings" and, if true, "leads directly to Humean skepticism, the condition in which you have a defeater for whatever you believe and cannot sensibly trust your cognitive faculties" (p. 19). He suggests that the reason naturalism can't accommodate the notion of proper function "is that this notion, the notion of proper function, essentially involves the aims and intentions of one or more conscious and intelligent designers" (p. 29). He also argues that naturalism leads to skepticism, is self-defeating ("if it is true, it is irrational to believe it"), and cannot accommodate belief ("if naturalism is true, no one believes anything") (p. 19).

While naturalism cannot employ Plantinga's concept of 'proper function', I suspect that it (1) can produce a view of the conditions in nature that living things require in order to survive, and (2) can form a rational view of what acts and conditions living things must endeavor to avoid if they are to survive, as well as what acts they should seek to do in order to have the best chance to continue to survive -- and this may be true even if no such being as the theistic God happens to exist. At the very least, it seems to be reasonable for a non-theist to hold such a belief. What the non-believer cannot do is employ Plantinga's concept of 'proper function', given Plantinga's view that proper function "essentially involves the aims and intentions of one or more conscious and intelligent designers" (p. 29). So, I believe that theism can provide a stronger explanation for the existence of intelligent human creatures than is provided by the Darwinian theory of evolution. One important question that remains is whether naturalism entails materialism. Plantinga thinks "that the vast majority of naturalists are materialists about human beings" and adds that he has been conducting his argument (that naturalism implies skepticism) under the assumption that to be a naturalist is to be a materialist (p. 49). I should add that while many, if not most, naturalists may be materialists, I'm not taking naturalism to entail materialism. Indeed, Plantinga does allow that a naturalist may be a dualist, and thus be able to accommodate beliefs. But he thinks that we have no reason to think that such beliefs will be true (p. 50). Perhaps, however, trial and error, as well as the apparent survival benefit of having true beliefs, provides us with such a reason, albeit, a weaker reason than theism may provide. In any case, it seems clear that Plantinga's main objection is not to naturalism as such, but to materialism. His justification for including naturalism is his view that the vast majority of naturalists are "materialists about human beings" (p. 49).

In Chapter 2, "Does God Exist?", after reviewing a variety of arguments against theism, Tooley considers whether the existence of God is epistemically justified -- arguing on the basis of the terrible evils in our world that the existence of God is very unlikely. He begins by considering one particular instance of evil: "the earthquake that destroyed Lisbon in 1755, which was felt as far away as southern France and North Africa, and which killed approximately 60,000 men, women, and children" (p. 116), from which he concludes that it is more likely than not that God does not exist (at least at the time of the earthquake). The argument rests on two basic claims: "It is logically necessary that, for any possible state of affairs S, if the action of choosing not to prevent S is morally wrong, all things considered, then an omnipotent, omniscient, morally perfect person would never perform that action" (p. 117); and "The Lisbon earthquake occurred, and the action of choosing not to prevent the Lisbon earthquake is morally wrong, all things considered" (p. 118). The next important claim is described as "a crucial probabilistic claim": "The property of choosing not to prevent an event that will cause the death of more than 50,000 ordinary people is a wrongmaking property of actions, and a very serious one" (p. 119). We then have a premise telling us that the probability that an action is wrong, "given that an action has a wrongmaking property we know of, and no rightmaking properties -- including ones of which we have no knowledge -- is greater than one half" (p. 120). This leads to the preliminary conclusion that:

The logical probability that God did not exist at the time of the Lisbon earthquake, given that choosing not to prevent the Lisbon earthquake has a wrongmaking property that we know of, and that there are no rightmaking properties known to be counterbalancing, is greater that one half. (p. 121)

Tooley sees a difficulty in reasoning from all known Ps are Qs to its being likely that all Ps are Qs -- where P is a good state of affairs and Q is 'P does not justify permitting a great evil such as tragic death of 60,000 men, women, and children' in the Lisbon earthquake -- as opposed to reasoning from all known Ps are Qs to its being likely that the next P is Q. While I fully agree with him that the first claim is "significantly stronger" than the second, I suspect that no rational human being who doesn't believe that God exists really thinks that there is some good state of affairs that morally justifies the permission of the suffering and death of 50,000 human beings in the Lisbon earthquake. This is not to say that it isn't better to use a weaker claim than a stronger claim, if the weaker claim can accomplish what the stronger claim was employed to do. Tooley's conclusion is that "unless there is countervailing evidence in support of the existence of God, or unless belief in the existence of God can be shown to be non-inferentially justified, and in a way that is not easily defeasible, the argument from evil establishes not only that one cannot know that God exists, but also, and even more unhappily, that it is unlikely -- indeed, extremely unlikely -- that God exists" (p. 146).

In Chapter 3, "Reply to Tooley's Opening Statement", Plantinga notes that the so-called "logical argument from evil" -- that the existence of evil is logically inconsistent with the existence of an omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good being who created the world -- has now been abandoned in favor of evidential arguments, arguments that, at best, show only that the existence of God is improbable or unlikely. He also notes that in addition to arguments for the existence of God there are religious experiences that are taken to be a basis for belief in God. Turning to Tooley's argument from evil, Plantinga questions Tooley's view that in the absence of any evidence for or against the existence of God, "the right or rational position is atheism" (p. 164). For in his opening statement Plantinga argued that via the "sensus divinitatis" there is non-propositional evidence for the existence of God (p. 164). However, setting aside such evidence and setting aside any evidence against the existence of God, Plantinga considers what he calls "the intrinsic probability of God's existence". Noting Tooley's view that the existence of an omnipotent, omniscient, wholly evil being, or the existence of an omnipotent, omniscient, morally indifferent being, is each as probable as the existence of an omnipotent, omniscient, morally perfect being, Plantinga questions Tooley's claim that atheism, not theism or agnosticism, is the rational position, given that there is no evidence, propositional or otherwise, for belief in God. "Why wouldn't agnosticism be perfectly rational?" (p. 165). I'm inclined here to accept Plantinga's point that in the situation under discussion -- no evidence either for or against the existence of God -- agnosticism may well be the rational position. My only reservation is my expectation that, should God (an omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good being who created the world) exist, he would want his creatures to have evidence sufficient for their coming to the rational belief that he exists -- realizing, of course, that many theists believe that this is precisely what God did before humans sinned. On the other hand, for human beings who while young came to believe in God and sought to serve him, and now seek some personal sense of God's presence, and do so sincerely in order to sustain their belief in him, and yet have no sense at all of his presence, it is difficult, if not perhaps unreasonable, I would say, for them to continue in their belief. Plantinga's sensus divinitatis is a wonderful idea. Unfortunately, it does not appear to be widespread. Nor does it appear to be true, at least for some, that anyone "who sincerely seeks, shall find".

In his reply to Tooley's opening statement, Plantinga considers his twenty-one step probabilistic argument from evil for the conclusion:

The logical probability that God did not exist at the time of the Lisbon earthquake, given that choosing not to prevent the Lisbon earthquake has a wrongmaking property that we know of, and that there are no rightmaking properties known to be counterbalancing, is greater than one half. (p. 121)

His first point is that even supposing that it can be shown that the existence of God is improbable with respect to the existence of evil, or a particular kind of evil, "God's existence might still be more likely than not on our total evidence" (p. 152). He also notes support among many classical theologians (Aquinas and others) for the view he himself holds: "God is a necessary being, he exists in every possible world; he could not have failed to exist" (p. 154). So, God can't be contingent, and therefore, exists in every possible world.

I think Plantinga is entirely correct in holding that God cannot be a contingent being, a being who exists in some possible worlds but does not exist in other possible worlds. For example, should he then happen to exist in the possible world that is actual, it allows us to imagine God bowing down and thanking his lucky stars that one of the worlds in which he exists just happens to be the actual world. Such a possibility represents, in my judgment, a demeaning view of God. There is good reason, therefore, to reject the view that God is a contingent being in the sense that he may exist in some possible worlds but fail to exist in others. On the other hand, an atheist, friendly or unfriendly, cannot rationally agree that God is a necessary being in the sense that he actually exists in every possible world. As a (hopefully possible) way out of this difficulty, I suggest the following conception of God: "God is such that if he exists in any possible world, he exists in every possible world". I suspect that theists, agnostics, and atheists can accept this proposition. All they then need disagree on is whether God exists in the actual world (the world in which we live and of which we have some direct knowledge). And they may agree on another important point: If he does exist in the actual world, he exists in every possible world; whereas, if he doesn't exist in the actual world, he exists in no possible world. If the former is true, God may be said to enjoy a sort of necessary existence; whereas, if the latter is true, God fails to exist in any possible world.

In Chapter 4, "Reply to Plantinga's Opening Statement", Tooley responds to Plantinga's "most important argument" to show that naturalism is untenable because "the probability that our cognitive faculties are reliable, given naturalism, is inscrutable" (p. 206). In his response Tooley contends that our perceptual faculties are not reliable in Plantinga's sense because "all the beliefs they naturally generate concerning secondary qualities are false, since they locate those properties in external physical objects, whereas those properties are in fact properties of experiences" (p. 216). We are simply mistaken, he suggests, when we think that the grass we see has the property of being green -- for the greenness is a property of the experience rather than of the grass that is seen. Only by supplementing our experiences with "scientific reasoning and theorizing" have we been able to "arrive at beliefs about the objects we perceive that are true, rather than false" (p. 216). Tooley concludes the chapter by pointing out (correctly, I believe) "that even if some argument against naturalism were sound, that would not serve to show that it was reasonable to believe in the existence of God" (p. 217).

In Chapter 5, "Can Robots Think? Reply to Tooley's Second Statement", Plantinga responds to Tooley's objections to his arguments against naturalism, focusing mainly on Tooley's attempt to explain how it is possible for a material object to think, and his reply to the evolutionary argument against naturalism. Plantinga notes, for example, that a number of prominent philosophers who are materialists share his intuition that material objects can't think, citing, for example, Paul Churchland and Jaegwon Kim (p. 222). Plantinga also notes, correctly in my judgment, that "An essential part of Tooley's attempt to show how a material object can think and have beliefs, therefore, is his assumption that such objects can have experiences" (p. 223) -- an assumption that Plantinga -- rightly in my judgment -- thinks he is not entitled to make. As Plantinga notes: "He's certainly entitled to argue for this proposition (he doesn't); but he can't sensibly just assume it" (p. 223). Plantinga concludes this part of his response by stating his "two main criticisms" of Tooley's (materialistic) naturalism.

First, the assumption that material objects can have experience is unsupported, gratuitous, and, in this context, question-begging. And second, the claim that a mere sequence of qualia can be a belief, with the entertainment with assent that goes with belief, is clearly false (pp. 226-227).

In Chapter 6, "Closing Statement and Response to Plantinga's Comments", Tooley discusses Plantinga's responses to his two arguments: his argument that atheism, rather than theism or agnosticism, is the default position; and his argument from evil against the existence of God. He explains that given that there are "degrees of belief" with respect, say, to theism or atheism,

it seems best to use the term 'agnostic' to cover cases where one thinks that the existence of God and the non-existence of God are equally likely, or where one has no subjective probability at all concerning the relevant proposition -- no degree of assent at all. (p. 254)

Another possible conception of agnosticism is simply the view that we lack knowledge with respect to the existence of God. One might be disposed to believe there is no God, but profess to be an agnostic because he doesn't know that God does not exist. Because of these considerations, I suspect it is somewhat restrictive for Tooley to limit "agnosticism" to cases where one "thinks that the existence and the non-existence of God are equally likely, or where one has no subjective probability at all concerning the relevant proposition -- no degree of assent at all" (p. 234).

Replying to Plantinga's response to his argument from evil (the Lisbon earthquake) -- "Tooley's premise presupposes that belief in God is not justified" (p. 171), Tooley claims that the fact that God permits the Lisbon earthquake does not justify him in permitting it -- "while it entails that there must have been a rightmaking property, it is not itself a rightmaking property" (p. 238). This remark seems right.

Tooley concludes his closing statement and response to Plantinga's comments, by considering the argument from evil versus justifications for believing in the existence of God. Recognizing that Anselm's ontological argument, an argument that Plantinga has defended, would, if successful, establish the necessary existence of an omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good being, he replies, without argument, that Gaunilo's objection can be used to show that there necessarily exists an omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly evil being.

This is a very fine book, presenting arguments for and against theism and naturalism by two very distinguished philosophers. I strongly recommend it for graduate level courses in philosophy of religion.