2008.07.05

Robin Le Poidevin

The Images of Time: An Essay on Temporal Representation

Robin Le Poidevin, The Images of Time: An Essay on Temporal Representation, Oxford University Press, 2007, 193pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199265893.

Reviewed by Craig Callender, University of California, San Diego


Does time pass? If not, then why do we think it does? Does memory have implications for whether past events exist? Do we have perceptual knowledge of succession and duration? Are there 'arts of space' and 'arts of time'? These questions and many others are tackled in this book on topics organized around the common theme of temporal representation. The book has three parts, each divided into three chapters. The first third is devoted mostly to the epistemological and metaphysical set-up, the second third to links between the metaphysics of time and temporal representation, and the final third to aesthetics and temporal representation.

Chapter 1 describes the overall argument, but to summarize it we really need the resources of Chapter 2. Chapter 2, 'Causal Theories of Representation', focuses on two questions about representation: what determines its content, and what determines its epistemic status? To the first Le Poidevin briefly argues in favor of a broadly Fodorian account: causation confers content. The second question is where the action is, for the discussion there formulates a principle that gets used repeatedly throughout the book. The principle, the Causal Truth-maker Principle (CTMP), states:

CTMP: 'Perceptual beliefs that qualify for the title 'knowledge' are caused, in part, by their truth-makers' (24).

Hence Le Poidevin defends a causal theory of perceptual knowledge, wherein (e.g.) the knowledge that my computer is in front of me is in part due to the causal chain emanating from the truth-maker of that claim, my computer actually being in front of me. After going through a host of objections, the author settles on a Nozickian version of reliabilism, according to which "knowledge is the exercise of a disposition in the right circumstances" (29). Le Poidevin believes that this variant of reliabilism handles Conee and Feldman's well-known 'generality problem' for reliabilism. I'm not sure it does, for I suspect the problem just gets swept into the evaluation of the dispositional counterfactuals. But it's not clear whether Le Poidevin really wants to go all-out for Nozick's account. The discussion is relatively brief, and he writes, "CTMP, perhaps suitably augmented, is, it seems, robust enough to deal with a number of apparent counter-examples" (31). My suspicion is that he would be happy if the reader agreed that CTMP gets many core intuitions about knowledge right.

With the CTMP now in hand, the methodology employed by the book can be explained. He writes, "This epistemological principle is, I suggest, a significant metaphysical tool, for it requires that the world contain items that are capable of playing two roles: those of causing and of making true our beliefs" (7). We'll return to this below.

Chapter 3 distinguishes egocentric from 'objective' representations and introduces the tensed and tenseless theories of time. Egocentric representations are essentially subject-centered, like the spatial 'here' and 'there', whereas objective representations are not, like the spatial 'next to x' and 'four miles from x'. (In the cognitive science literature, 'objective' is usually called 'allocentric' or 'exocentric'.) Le Poidevin describes Piaget's famous experiments wherein young children have trouble with thinking non-egocentrically with spatial relations among objects. Turning to time, he asks, are there counterparts of egocentric and objective representations? It seems there are: 'now', 'past' and so on are egocentric and 'before 1990', 'simultaneous with', etc. are objective. However, how you understand these representations will hang on your temporal metaphysics. Presentists and other tensed theorists believe the egocentric categories latch onto the world, whereas detensers or 'block' theorists believe the 'objective' ones do. For tensers, there is an asymmetry between time and space here. The egocentric category of 'now' refers to the metaphysically distinguished present, but the egocentric 'here' does not. (Le Poidevin manages to resist the urge, in light of Piaget's experiment, to brand tensers as "childish" with respect to time.) Keen to make room for the tenseless theory of time, Le Poidevin provides a tenseless semantics for temporal egocentric expressions and rebuts an argument that a tenseless language is impossible. However, still worried by the tensed assault, he ends the chapter claiming, "what needs to be shown is that there is a role for such a [tenseless] language" (53). The next chapter on memory is supposed to do so. I wondered, however, why the existence of physics, especially relativistic physics, didn't merit mentioning, for surely it shows that there is a role for tenseless language.

Chapter 4 makes a surprising argument: that the existence of episodic memory favors the tenseless theory of time. Hanging on the CTMP and other principles (the author likes principles), the argument defies description in a short space. But the intuition behind it is roughly as follows. Memory, when it counts as knowledge, inherits what makes it knowledge from something else, say, perception. My knowledge of having seen Lisa yesterday is only knowledge because the memory is connected to my really seeing Lisa yesterday. If I just had the memory, but no actual experience, it wouldn't be knowledge. Tension with tense theories arise, however, because according to the tenser the fact of seeing Lisa is changing; it is now, when I have the memory, no longer the same fact. The memory and the experience are not both of the same event: the experience is of a present event, the memory of a past event. As a result, the tenser then runs afoul of the CTMP, a few new principles, plus Le Poidevin's definition of episodic memory, for the remembered event is not, strictly speaking, in the causal chain of both the memory and the experience.

Le Poidevin sketches various presentist retorts, adjusts his conclusion slightly, but still claims that the tenseless theory "sits much more comfortably with our intuitive view of the epistemology of memory" (75) than does the tensed view. I suspect most presentists could live with this. What were the odds on our intuitive view of the epistemology of memory being correct anyway? Note that the claim is not actually that episodic memory favors the block view. How could it be? Presentist and block theories are at the very least empirically equivalent hypotheses -- indeed, many fear they are even metaphysically equivalent. The claim is not even that episodic memory as scientists use the terminology needs to be reformed under a presentist interpretation, for Le Poidevin's episodic memory isn't the same as theirs. The author has instead built various epistemological conditions into the definition of episodic memory (p. 62). So the argument boils down to whether or not this defined category, allegedly true of some memories, sits well with presentism. There are plenty of principles the presentist could contest. Yet surely they expected some mild revisionism about memories anyway, given their commitment to the idea that the past doesn't exist?

Chapter 5 not only has the best title, 'Projecting the Present: The Shock of the Now', but it also has some of the most exciting material. The central idea is to rebut the claim that experience favors the tensed theory. The tensed theory is commonly supposed to be closer to the phenomenology of time, but is this right? Le Poidevin criticizes the idea that we only perceive the present, explains why there is such intersubjective agreement about what events are past, present and future, and then attacks the idea that the perception of change and motion supply motivation for tenses. He ends the chapter with an expression of sympathy for a projectivist account of the tensed now, an account for which I have real sympathy. I think most philosophers of time will find this chapter very stimulating.

Chapter 6, 'The Wider View: Precedence and Duration', introduces what Le Poidevin calls the 'epistemological puzzle of time perception'. Assuming we sometimes have knowledge of precedence and duration, the puzzle arises from the conflict of two claims, the CTMP and the idea that the objective order and duration of events are not the causes of our perceptual beliefs concerning order and duration. Le Poidevin considers the response that order and duration are mind-dependent, wisely rejects it, and then chooses to modify the CTMP to an explanatory claim: perceptual knowledge is, in part, explained by its truth-makers.

Le Poidevin advertises this puzzle as one about time, and I guess it is, but I wasn't convinced that it was more temporal than spatial. Maybe, due to asymmetries in our psychological mechanism, we see the spatial topology and metric in a way we don't the temporal. More would need to be said to convince me of this, however, for cognitive science recently seems to be discovering temporal counterparts of many spatial mechanisms. As far as the epistemological puzzle is concerned, I would suggest that the spatial and temporal are in the same boat. The CTMP famously runs into trouble with mathematical knowledge, so it isn't too great a surprise that it's awkward with topological and metrical knowledge too. In any case, it's significant that the author modifies the CTMP.

As art is not my specialty and I'm running out of space, I'll briefly describe the central claims of chapters 7-9. Chapter 7 asks the question whether pictures are capable of depicting time, change and motion. The critic Ernst Gombrich attacks G.E. Lessing's idea that pictures are incapable of such depiction, basing his argument on rather controversial metaphysical and psychological claims. Le Poidevin separates the implausible theses out in an attempt to rescue Gombrich's main conclusion. Chapter 8 raises a question for some accounts of truth in fiction, in particular, an issue that arises when a character in a fiction makes future-tensed statements. And Chapter 9 asks whether time can be fictionally disunified. Can there be distinct and multiple time streams in one work of fiction?

Le Poidevin breaks away from many traditional disputes in philosophy of time, going into psychology, aesthetics, literary theory, and cognitive science. So from this perspective the book is very fresh and innovative. However, methodologically, I found the book a bit old-fashioned. The central chapters assume that reality had better be such to make sense of our applications of the concept knowledge. But is this, as opposed to science, the right entry point from which to learn about the world? If I had more space, I would argue that it isn't the right approach. Le Poidevin mentions the occasional scientific result, but he rarely uses them. The results are sometimes dated, and there are plenty of omissions -- even when they might bolster his arguments. And notably, he skips work on temporal representation itself in the philosophical foundations of cognitive science. The stress is always on a priori epistemological principles and the puzzles they engender. Whether this is the most promising way to approach temporal representation can't be decided here, but a warning should be made to those looking for a book that approaches these topics more naturalistically.

Overall, however, Le Poidevin should be praised for crafting his own research projects and shining a light on temporal representation from such a wide variety of topics. Not many books address topics in philosophy of mind, psychology, cognitive science, epistemology, metaphysics of time, philosophy of art, and literary criticism! Readers looking for a book with fresh material and challenging arguments to think about will find one here.