2008.07.06

John Leslie

Immortality Defended

John Leslie, Immortality Defended, Blackwell, 2007, 97pp., $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405162043.

Reviewed by Charles Taliaferro, St. Olaf College


Immortality Defended is a book that begins with high altitude Platonism. Readers are not given much space to become acclimatized, for by the third page we encounter a Platonic view of truth and an axiology in which the good (which is said to be beyond existence) can account for the cosmos, and the thesis that "the world's patterns are nothing but divine thought-patterns" (3). Because of this compact on-rush of ideas, the first chapter is aptly sub-titled "A Rapid Introduction" (emphasis mine). For those familiar with Leslie's other work, beginning with his well received and much discussed Value and Existence (1979), Immortality Defended will be a satisfying overview of Leslie's speculative philosophy with some new arguments about the cosmos and value, but newcomers are liable to find some of this book chaotic and underdeveloped. There is also some unfortunate repetition as Leslie seeks to bolster his axiology with appeals to philosophers who are sympathetic with his undertaking (e.g. repeated references to A.C. Ewing, Keith Ward, Nicholas Rescher, John Polkinghorne). Even so, this slender volume has some rich material that should be taken seriously by those working in value theory and metaphysics. (The fact that thinkers such as Ewing took a Platonic theory like Leslie's seriously is a good reason for us to do so as well.)

There are five chapters. The 'rapid' first chapter employs the concepts of facts, truth, value, and reality as thoroughly realist notions without taking account of observers or language-users or conceptual schemes. Even with no cosmos at all, there would still be possibilities: "even dragons would be possibilities" (1). In the spirit of Spinoza, Leslie sketches a concept of the natural world as itself a divine mind. The first chapter essentially packs in much of the philosophical positions he will then go on to further articulate and defend. Chapter two focuses on the crucial move at the heart of Leslie's systematic philosophy: the cosmos can (in principle) be explained by the good (or what he sometimes refers to as an "ethical ground") that functions as a creative principle. He defends a normative account of values notwithstanding worries about empirical verification and the problem of evil. Leslie believes that our cosmos is worthy of divine thought, despite the enormity of cosmic ills, and he speculates that God may be contemplating far richer, better worlds than ours. There is some hint of the principle of plentitude in his approach to values: ours may not be the best world and it may be worse than many actual worlds but it is nonetheless worthy of existence. Chapter three elucidates the relationship between divine and human minds, appealing to quantum theory. Chapter four outlines and defends three forms of immortality, while chapter five contains an impressive case for a teleological account of the cosmos based on fine-tuning. Several sections of this chapter ("Evidence from the World's Causal Orderliness," "Evidence from Cosmic Fine Tuning," and "Philosophical Attempts to Shrug Off the Fine-Tuning") should be read by all those interested in teleological, theistic arguments. The book concludes with an overview of his version of pantheism, "the belief that nothing exists except divine thinking" (88).

Let me turn now to some brief comments on Leslie's Platonic account of creation, the relationship between divine and human minds, and immortality.

Leslie seems to acknowledge the difficulty of securing his foundational position that the good or an ethical requirement can itself be a creative cause, bringing into being or accounting for a cosmos. This is partly because the good is not a concrete individual thing. Leslie defends his position, in part, by comparison with theism, arguing that his thesis is no more odd than theism. But in a theistic metaphysics, creative power is ascribed to a substantial individual not an abstract object. Theism involves a form of teleological explanation (a subject intentionally bringing about a good state of affairs) that we readily observe in our own case, whereas we have nothing to help us grasp how it is that an ethical requirement (a principle or property) can itself bring about events. The difficulty is apparent in the following passage in which Leslie claims that 'the ethical requirement that there be a cosmos of a certain type' does not require any causal mechanism or complex means of bringing about a cosmos. He proposes that the efficacy of this moral requirement would not "involve clockwork whirring, hammers hammering, magnets attracting or repelling, magic wands waving, words of power being spoken, or complex annihilatory forces" (33). The creative power of the ethical requirement is basic and ultimate, not accounted for in terms of any further cause.

Given an ethical need for a cosmos of such and such a kind, nothing would "make" this need able to bring about its own fulfillment … . You might almost as well believe that some magic want "made" phenomenal blue nearer to phenomenal purple than to phenomenal red, or that a deity's command "made" unvarying misery worse in itself than interestingly varied happiness. (33)

But while it is plausible to think that some causal powers are indeed basic, it is (I suggest) more plausible to think such causal powers inhere in substantial individuals rather than in abstract properties. On Platonic grounds, we may rightly question whether a deity's command can make misery or happiness have such and such value. But surely we can better grasp the intelligibility of an agent bringing about states of affairs that involve misery or happiness for the sake of some good, and doing so as a matter of basic power, than we can grasp how it is that a principle about the values of misery or happiness may itself bring about events.

While Leslie's radical Platonic account of creation seems counter-intuitive, this is not to say that goodness could not have an explanatory role if it were seen as part of the nature of a substantial individual. For example, Leslie's axiology seems to me most plausible in offering an account or explanation of God's existence. This, in fact, is the point that Ewing found most promising in what may be called Platonic theism: God exists because of God's perfect goodness. The 'because' here is not a case in which 'perfect goodness' is an efficient cause that in some way existed antecedent to God and somehow brought God into being. God's existence and God's perfection may be deemed as logically (and metaphysically) co-extensive. But, arguably, one may see (or understand) that God must exist insofar as one grasps that God is perfect and that essential existence (along with other great-making, compossible properties) is a divine attribute. As Leslie says, citing Ewing: "'God's existence,' … can be necessary '… because it was supremely good that God should exist'" (21). The 'because' here may be characterized as a non-causal explanation insofar as it serves to make evident that God exists in light of supreme goodness, rather than to offer an account of how it is that 'supreme goodness' caused God to be.

As to the relationship of divine and human minds, Leslie offers sound replies to some objections that individual human persons cannot be part of a divine mind. He effectively overturns the objection that we cannot be parts of the same mind on the grounds that we have contradictory beliefs or we may even deny that there is a divine mind. But I do not find Leslie providing a compelling reason to overturn what certainly appears to be our substantial individuality. Insofar as you and I appear to be substantial individuals, it is very difficult to assimilate ourselves to being modes of a divine mind. The following passage displays some of the reasons why theists find Leslie's work of great significance, but also why theists resist going all the way with Leslie's pantheism:

It does seem that belief in God could find support in (a) the fact that ours is a life-permitting universe, (b) the fact that it has causal orderliness, and (c) the sheer truth that it is a case of there being 'something rather than nothing': something more than a Platonic realm of truths about possibilities … . The combination of Platonism and pantheism, however, could offer us something more plausible [than classical theism]. Pantheism puts us inside a divine mind, Platonism then giving a reason for that mind's existence. Our world's reality, its patterns, its life-permitting character, might all be rather tidily explained when God's existence was treated in something like Spinoza's fashion. (83, 84)

In this passage, Leslie indicates his own favorable estimation of a teleological argument, but when he takes the further step of placing individuals within God's mind theists have and will worry that this 'tidy explanation' undermines the very nature of creatures as concrete individual subjects distinct from the Creator. Spinoza himself did not reserve a concept of creaturely independence of God, and it is hard to see how Leslie might fare better than the great 17th century "God-intoxicated" philosopher.

Leslie's treatment of immortality is worth the price of the book. He offers a nuanced overview of types of immortality, arguing that insofar as his fundamental axiology is correct about the good ethical requirement for the existence of the cosmos, and insofar as our continued existence is itself a good, there are grounds for believing in life beyond death. Here is a summary of our predicament which, if Leslie is correct, may involve three forms of immortality:

When our bodies had died we should presumably be in existence "back there along the fourth dimension," as Einstein thought, which would make us in some interesting sense immortal, but we could have the immortality of an ever-increasing share of the wonders of infinite thought … . Suppose, however, that both "Einsteinian immorality" and an afterlife were fictions. We should still have immortality of a third type for which people have sometimes hoped. The divine mind that had lived our lives as tiny elements of its thinking would continue to exist forever. (88)

In this short book, Leslie has articulated and defended a challenging, provocative system that addresses the great subjects in the history of philosophy: God, the self, the nature and origin of the cosmos, value, and immortality.