2008.07.16

J. L. Schellenberg

The Wisdom to Doubt: A Justification of Religious Skepticism

J. L. Schellenberg, The Wisdom to Doubt: A Justification of Religious Skepticism, Cornell University Press, 2007, 326pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780801445545.

Reviewed by Stephen Wykstra, Calvin College and Timothy Perrine, Calvin College


"Reason requires us to be religious skeptics." So opens John Schellenberg's new book The Wisdom to Doubt. Schellenberg focuses on "Ultimism," the claim -- a kind of lowest common denominator of any serious religion -- that there exists a reality that is both "ultimate" (of unsurpassable metaphysical greatness) and "salvific" (crucial to our deepest flourishing as humans). Schellenberg argues that reason requires us to withhold belief about whether Ultimism is true or false. Such "religious skepticism" is, as he presents it, a religiously serious stance, giving our best hope for -- eventually -- finding truth about the Ultimate.

In Part I, Schellenberg forges a general principle for determining when skeptical "withholding" is required, and uses this principle to build a four-fold case for skepticism about Ultimism. Part II argues against those who think they can avoid skepticism by virtue of strong evidence for either theism or naturalism. Part III argues that we should not be skeptics about theism: evidence shows this version of Ultimism is false. The book has fourteen densely textured and "unhurried" (as Penelhum's blurb on the back cover puts it) chapters. We will sketch some representative lines of argument in each chapter, and indicate some areas that need critical probing.

Part I rests on a principle. Consider any proposition P for which you have some body of relevant evidence e. Suppose that e is (as you see) good evidence for P. (By "good" Schellenberg means (p. 15) that if e were all the evidence "needing to be considered," it would "make P certainly or probably true." He does not clarify the antecedent of this subjunctive.) For P to be something you can reasonably believe, Schellenberg argues, it must be reasonable for you to think that your good evidence e is "representative" of the total evidence. That is, letting e* be the evidence relevant to P which is unknown to you, it must be reasonable for you to think that if e* were to become known and added to e, the resultant total evidence (call it E) would still underwrite P (and do so, presumably, as strongly as current evidence e does). If this condition is not met, i.e., if you have good reason to doubt whether adding e* to e would still underwrite P, then reason requires you -- despite your good evidence e for P -- to refrain from believing P.

Since e* is unknown to you, applying the above principle will typically rest on meta-considerations about e and e*. We will refer to such considerations as "meta-evidence"; and we will refer to Schellenberg's principle as his Meta-Evidence Condition, or MEC:

(MEC) Even when S has good evidence e for proposition P, S must suspend belief regarding P if S has meta-evidence that:

(C1) gives S good reason to think S has missed some relevant evidence e*, and

(C2) gives S good reason to doubt whether the conjunction of e and e* would still underwrite the same positive verdict for P.

Using MEC, Schellenberg's first four chapters adduce four "modes" of meta-evidence that, he thinks, require skepticism about Ultimism. Chapter One, his "Subject Mode," comprises meta-evidence about us, the subjects considering claims about the Ultimate. We are not only finite, but also prone to pride, intellectual greed, insecurity, and a host of other foibles that incline us to overrate evidence for claims we like, and to disregard alternatives. Our finitude and foibles make for evidential distortion, especially for propositions that are precise, detailed, profound, and attractive. Precise and detailed propositions have many significant alternatives; given our finitude, any of these alternatives may have much unrecognized evidence on its behalf. Profound and attractive propositions, given our foibles, lead us to misperceive the evidence we have and to neglect evidence easily available to us. Ultimism exhibits all four of these characteristics. The Subject Mode alone, Schellenberg concludes (p. 47), "can make short work of the claim that religious belief, or that irreligious belief, is justified … ."

In Chapter Two, Schellenberg gives meta-evidence pertaining to the object of religious belief. This object, being metaphysically ultimate, leads serious thinkers, like Spinoza, to see the Ultimate as both "infinitely dimensional" and "inexhaustible." (Theism, Schellenberg thinks, here tends to reduce the greatness of the Ultimate by qualifying it as personal.) This inexhaustible and infinite dimensionality means that any specific way of "filling out" the idea of the Ultimate based on limited evidence is likely to be "exploded" by the infinite possibilities that finite cognizers do not (and shall never) know. Here we are simply "out of our depth": the generic claim of Ultimism thus brings us to a place that is (p. 51) "literally beyond human belief."

In Chapter Three, giving his "Retrospective Mode," Schellenberg finds that our past gives strong meta-evidence to doubt that our current evidence about the Ultimate is representative. Religious inquiry has been going on for a relatively short time, and has been so riddled with moral, psychological, and social flaws as to scarcely qualify as inquiry. Schellenberg tellingly reviews the flaws -- intellectual hubris, narrow social loyalties, sectarian violence, authoritarianism, gender-biased values, and the emotional attractions and social roles of institutional religion. They give us, he argues, ample reason to doubt whether any current evidence-base for or against Ultimism is representative of the full evidence.

His "Prospective Mode" of Chapter Four deepens this case by contrasting this religious past with a vision of improved future inquiry on which we might, even now, be on the cusp. He envisions generations of humans in diverse communities engaging in sustained ecumenical conversation, comparing results of a wide range of intellectual inquiries (science, art, and the like) and spiritual practices. The practitioners would, in effect, be experientially testing various versions of Ultimism. Such pluralistic inquiry, over time, could go in one of two directions. It might lead to a kind of disconfirmation of proposed versions of Ultimism. Alternatively, it might lead to a confirmation of some single version of Ultimism. Contrasting such envisioned future inquiry with our flawed religious past heightens both modes. Schellenberg's Chapter Five argues that all four modes amplify each other when combined together, and Chapter Six defends the irrelevance of pragmatic considerations when belief is at stake. Part I thus builds a strong meta-evidential case that the full evidence "might well underwrite a view entirely at odds with anything suggested by our evidence so far." This means, by MEC, that we should be doxastic fence-sitters about Ultimism.

In Part Two, Schellenberg takes on two rivals. Chapter Seven dismantles the leading irreligious worldview: Dennett-style naturalism, which, with some worries, he defines as the claim that there are no supernatural entities. Current naturalists tend to support this worldview by appeal to the success of science. Schellenberg considers three versions of this argument, finding each sorely wanting. The most important version argues that the success of science in explaining physical events by purely natural causes gives us strong reason to believe that there exist no supernatural entities that affect nature or the physical universe. Against this, Schellenberg's first objection argues that explanatory "success" must here be success in getting at true explanations. He then utilizes what philosophers of science call "the Pessimistic Induction." Given the regularity with which our best past theories have been replaced by even better incompatible alternatives, we should regard belief in the truth of current successful explanatory theories as unjustified. Second, Schellenberg argues that naturalists haven't given reason to think that scientific theories address the full range of the world we experience. A third problem is that success-of-science naturalists need to show (and haven't) that the success of science is more probable on naturalism than on the best Ultimist alternatives to naturalism. The Dennett-style naturalist, Schellenberg concludes (p. 157), "regularly overestimates the accomplishments of science and underestimates the potential of religion."

In Chapter Eight, Schellenberg challenges a second leading alternative to skepticism: contemporary defense of theistic belief by appeal to religious experience. Here Schellenberg sets up the issue as whether first-person religious experience can give "immunity" against the skeptical considerations he has advanced in Part I. That is, do first-person religious experiences give a religious belief the sort of warrant that means the experiment "need not worry" (p. 162) about public evidence that seems to require skepticism? Schellenberg here targets Plantinga, Swinburne, and Alston. On his reading, Plantinga, after defending religious belief as grounded in "a basic way" on private religious experience, goes on "invariably" (p. 163) to say that this renders superfluous an answer to arguments from evil or other difficult objections based on public evidence.

As Schellenberg sees it, Plantinga's view makes the religious believer's position analogous to the position of a voter whose private experience in a voting booth justifies her belief that she was misled by the ballot, and justifies her belief in such a way that she need not worry about arguments from public evidence that might be directed against this belief. In response, Schellenberg identifies ways in which typical religious experience falls short of what such a voter has to go on. The deficits here include lack of forcefulness, and lack of congruence of content between the experience and the associated belief, and so on. Schellenberg argues that because of such deficits, one cannot sidestep defeaters based on public evidence (in particular the facts of religious diversity and the serious possibilities of misperception they raise) by appeal to private first-hand religious experience.

Schellenberg then turns to the "more sophisticated" approaches of Swinburne and Alston. Both urge that near-universal skepticism can be avoided only by taking an "innocent until proven guilty" approach to experiential justification which opens the door wide to experientially justified religious belief. Swinburne thus endorses a "Principle of Credulity" on which one is justified in believing any proposition p whenever -- barring defeaters -- one has an experience in which it (epistemically) appears to one that p is the case. Alston, similarly, argues that one is justified in believing any proposition so long as the belief is licensed by an experiential belief-forming practice in which one "finds oneself" that is both socially established and has an internal "over-rider system" for identifying known non-veridical experiences. By an "innocent until proven guilty" approach, both Swinburne and Alston think that experiential justification can play a weighty role in rendering theistic belief reasonable.

Schellenberg finds this far too liberal. To avoid universal skepticism, he argues (p. 170), we need only extend the presumption of innocence to those doxastic and valuative practices that are "universal and unavoidable," and to the very basic picture of the world that goes with these practices. Such "doxastic minimalism," Schellenberg thinks, is dictated by the aim -- binding on reasonable human beings -- of seeking through investigation to "fill in" the basic human picture of the world with further true beliefs. The aim justifies embracing the privileged set of unavoidable and universal doxastic practices (for without these investigation would not be possible at all), while requiring any other special belief-forming practices to be secured via the deliverances of the privileged practices.

With this "doxastic minimalism" in place, Schellenberg revisits the problem of religious diversity. The public facts of religious diversity, he argues, pose an extremely serious challenge to how things seem "from the inside" in first-person religious experiences. Schellenberg here interacts with Alston, who argues that one can and should combine serious reflection on rival religious practices while still "sitting tight" (doxastically speaking) with the practice in which one finds oneself. Schellenberg finds this inadequate, as it regards the experiences of others as misperceptions while not extending a similar suspicion to one's own experience.

At the same time, Schellenberg promotes a weakened form of Alston's position: it might, he thinks, be reasonable to let an Alstonian religious-experiential practice guide one's "acceptance" of certain propositions about the Ultimate, so long as one does not actually "believe" these propositions, which imperils one's ability to investigate with due regard for evidence. (Since Schellenberg uses the term "belief" in a narrower sense than is common in epistemology, it is here, and elsewhere, not clear whether his proposals represent real disagreements with Alston and others.) At any rate, Schellenberg seems to permit acceptance-oriented "faith-practices," based on pragmatic considerations, to help orient one's life. These allow for a "larger, more inclusive loyalty" (p. 177) to evidential dialogue with adherents to other traditions, consistent with his "Prospective Mode" vision of religious inquiry.

In Part III, Schellenberg adds atheism to his skepticism about generic Ultimism. Theism, he argues, is one version of Ultimism about which the evidence warrants disbelief. His four chapters on divine hiddenness, horrendous evil, and the "Free Will Offense" set forth new arguments that the God of theism does not exist.

Chapters Nine and Ten develop his arguments from hiddenness. His "love-based" arguments here rest on three main claims. The first is that necessarily, if the Ultimate is a supremely loving Person (as theism proclaims), then for all spiritually capable creatures (let's call such creatures "persons"), it is only via a developing relationship with God that they can find their deepest good. Accordingly -- Schellenberg's second claim -- a loving God will, necessarily, ensure that all persons who are not resisting a relationship with God will be in a position to participate in this relationship. But -- his third claim -- such a relationship is possible only for persons who believe that God exists. These three claims jointly entail a proposition lethal to theism: necessarily, if the God of theism exists, then there are no "nonresistant non-believers." That is, there are no persons who are not resisting God, but who nevertheless lack belief that God exists. But in the actual world there are non-resistant non-believers aplenty. So God does not exist.

Here, as elsewhere, our skeletal summary cannot convey the rich methodological, psychological, and cultural detail by which Schellenberg fills in his case. In Chapter Nine, Schellenberg uses telling analogies to argue (not analogically, but by way of concept-explication) that a supremely loving Personal God would not do less than we expect of falteringly loving human persons. More of this concrete psychological rumination comes to the fore in Chapter Ten, where his descriptions of four types of "non-resistant non-believers" give agnosticism a human face. The types are (i) former believers who once seemed to experience a relationship with God which they then lost; (ii) lifelong searchers who seek but do not find a relationship with God; (iii) converts who, through honest inquiry, move from theism to some non-theistic religion; and (iv) non-theists who have never heard of God. In these types, Schellenberg argues, we find distinct forms of non-resistant non-belief, each of which, given his earlier necessary truths about a loving God, demonstrate God's non-existence.

In Chapter Eleven, Schellenberg develops his argument from "horrific suffering." His two main premises here are that if God exists, God will allow a person to suffer horrifically only if doing so is required for the deepest good of that person, namely, "endless intimate fellowship" giving ever-increasing knowledge of God. But, God's allowing horrific suffering is clearly not required for this deepest good. So God does not exist.

By unhurried ruminations, Schellenberg here weaves a spell that gives both premises considerable attraction. God's perfection, he stresses, entails God's having perfect knowledge of every kind, including perfect knowledge of the inner "feel" of all experiences (actual and possible) of finite creatures. A perfect God thus feels perfectly and completely -- from the inside as it were -- each creature's experience of suffering. Coupling this with perfect compassion means that the theistic God must be "maximally opposed" to such suffering. Now this maximal opposition itself seems to be given as a refutation of theism: if God were maximally opposed to such suffering, Schellenberg suggests (p. 247), then this alone "should be enough to prevent God" from actualizing such a world as ours. But Schellenberg's main path goes from this maximal opposition to a further claim: if God is maximally opposed to horrific suffering, then God will never allow a person to suffer horrifically unless doing so is required for the aforementioned deepest good for that person. Schellenberg's striking idea here is that even if there were other finite goods of such preciousness that they outweigh the horrific evil, and had the evil as a necessary condition, it would still be inconsistent with God's perfect nature to allow the evil just for the sake of those outweighing goods. Only the deepest good -- eternally knowing God -- would be enough. Completing the argument, Schellenberg then advances a battery of considerations to show that allowing horrific suffering is not required for this deepest good of ever-deepening divine-human intimacy.

In Chapter Twelve, Schellenberg, turning the standard Free Will Defense on its head, gives us his "Free Will Offense." He begins by upgrading the compatibilist notion of freedom. Schellenberg argues that standard analogies against compatibilism -- "puppet master," "divine manipulator," etc. -- wildly miss the mark. He then presents a Pereboom-like case that compatibilism can quite nicely accommodate what theism deems as the "deepest good" for creatures like ourselves (an ever-deepening relationship with God). There can be, he argues (p. 279), "deeply interesting and meaningful interaction between God and finite persons … without free will and without evil."

With these points in hand, he advances to the offense. Suppose we accept the standard claim that incompatibilism allows for the possibility of horrific evils. Given that compatibilism can accommodate our deepest good, we now get a new argument against theism. A good God would give creatures incompatibilist freedom only if alternate schemes of divine-human interaction exhibited less good than those schemes involving incompatibilist freedom. (Why risk the bad of horrific suffering for a creature, unless it was the only way to achieve the creature's deepest good?) But the deepest good can be achieved without free will and its attendant risks. So God would not give his creatures incompatibilist freedom. In this way Schellenberg argues (p. 283) "either God exists or there is free will (but not both)." That is: if we have (incompatibilist) free will, then God does not exist, since free will needlessly introduces the possibility of horrific evils. If Schellenberg is right, either theists or free-will defenders of theism should (in an ideal rational world) become an endangered species.

In Chapter 14, "Closing the Case" against theism, Schellenberg argues that his claim to have found disproofs of theism is consistent with his earlier case for skepticism towards Ultimism. Its "personalist" interpretation of the Ultimate makes theism vulnerable to disproof in a way that better versions of Ultimism are not. We do, Schellenberg thinks, have a clear grasp of what it takes to be a person (whether a finite or infinite one), and on his doxastic minimalism, we should endorse the deliverances of our rational/intuitive belief-forming practices when they are applied to concepts that we clearly grasp. So while reason requires us to withhold belief about whether Ultimism is true, it requires us to believe theistic versions of Ultimism are false.

One might think that Schellenberg's anti-theistic arguments here -- especially his hiddenness arguments -- are vulnerable to the "Skeptical Gambit" that skeptical theists like Alston, van Inwagen, Howard-Snyder, and Wykstra wield against other leading evidential arguments for atheism. Schellenberg claims his case is not vulnerable in the same way. The so-called "skeptical theists" argue that many arguments from evil fail because if theism is true, it is entirely expectable that the goods of which we are aware, in our own dealings with reality as finite creatures, are likely to be entirely unrepresentative of the goods that really exist. Schellenberg thinks the Skeptical Gambit -- of which (p. 303) his own Part I strategy is an expanded version -- does not affect his own anti-theistic arguments; for these, he says (p. 300), are not inductive but deductive, relying on premises that are "clearly true or (in many cases) necessarily true."

Last, Schellenberg urges that theists who find his atheistic arguments unconvincing as proofs should still grant that they give strong reason to retract belief and to sit on the doxastic fence about the truth of theism. His idea here is that his discovery of these new arguments is itself evidence that the future contains more relevant evidence than is dreamed of by religious inquiry so far. Even if arguments fail to clinch the case for atheism, they support religious skepticism a la his earlier "Prospective Mode." At this stage of human history, what Ultimism requires of us is a doxastic humility unstained by either belief or disbelief. Such skepticism is, for Schellenberg, a stance of hope, a reverence for truth as-yet-ungrasped, and a necessary condition for "a new and more illuminating beginning" in our quest for wisdom about that which, ultimately speaking, matters most.

We now probe a few potential problem areas in Schellenberg's case.

On Schellenberg's MEC Principle, it is not reasonable to believe any proposition P, even when one has good evidence e for it, unless it is reasonable for one think that

(ReP) e is representative of the total evidence for P.

Schellenberg employs MEC negatively: he lays out evidential considerations against ReP so as to make it unreasonable to think that ReP is true. In doing this, Schellenberg is, we think, best seen as intending to give evidence for the proposition that

It is seriously-possible that ~ReP

which (turning the tilde to a "T") we'll call STREP. One set of worries centers on whether his evidential considerations, to do their job, must also satisfy MEC. Are they meant to make it reasonable to believe that STREP is true? Must it then, by MEC, be reasonable for Schellenberg to think his evidential considerations are representative of the "total" evidence bearing on STREP?

This is tricky because the sort of "serious possibility" being asserted by STREP is serious epistemic possibility -- and what determines epistemic possibilities seems to be not total evidence (in the MECian sense), but just the evidence one has (or, perhaps, that one has available). This raises the worry that we may here have a counterexample to MEC. A more pressing worry is that Schellenberg's evidential considerations may be neutralized by other considerations that he is forgetting or ignoring. Schellenberg stresses, for example, the infinite dimensionality of the Ultimate, the limited time-scale during which humans have engaged in serious religious inquiry, and the foible-filled cognitive propensities of humans in the religious domain. Considerations like these, he says, open a serious epistemic possibility that whatever we may take as good evidence for or against Ultimism is entirely unrepresentative of the "total evidence." Thus, by MEC, we are not in a position to have any non-skeptical beliefs worth having about the Ultimate.

But as Schellenberg himself stresses, Ultimism is a highly generic disjunctive claim, whose disjuncts consist of all the known and unknown specific versions of Ultimism. Many of these versions specify that the Ultimate is "mind-like" (or "personal"). If some such theistic version is true, it is plausible to suppose that the Ultimate (that is, God) would make special provisions for enabling humans to have cognitive access to salvifically-relevant truths about the Divine. Such provisions (which might include what theism terms "general" and "special" revelation) are especially expectable on theism if -- as Schellenberg himself argues is necessarily true -- theism entails that our deepest good is knowing God. Theism thus gives considerable reason to expect a form of cognitive access to God despite -- our perhaps even because of -- our finite and foible-filled human nature.

Hence, if we deem it seriously possible that some theistic version of Ultimism is true, we must deem it seriously possible that the considerations here stressed by Schellenberg (infinite dimensionality and the like) are unrepresentative of the evidence we have. This casts its strongest shadow over Schellenberg's inference -- central to Part I -- that his own considerations require skepticism about Ultimism as a generic disjunctive claim, and therefore also require skepticism about each disjunct. Here the devil is in the details, for the inference does not succeed insofar as some of those concrete versions are immune to the generic considerations. One must worry that Schellenberg, in stressing as he does on considerations of time-scale, infinite dimensionality, and the like, is in a question-begging way assuming from the outset that the theistic disjuncts are not serious possibilities.

We also worry that Schellenberg, despite his stress on the "infinite dimensionality" of the reality posited by Ultimism, seriously underestimates the dimensionality of the divine-human relationship posited by theism, especially Judeo-Christian versions of theism. In his hiddenness arguments against theism, for example, Schellenberg treats it as obvious, to all but the willfully blind or socially benighted, that many non-believers are not at all resistant toward God. But he gives little reflection to what, on the most plausible versions of theism, resistance to God would be, to what forms it might take, or to its possible corporate dimensions. These things are highly germane to his arguments. One of Schellenberg's unargued premises, for example, is that if a person does not have any explicit concept of God, then that person's non-belief cannot be due to resistance toward God. But traditional Christian theism seems to teach (e.g., Romans 2:12-16) that either resistance to God or its opposite can take the form of a person's response to a moral law "written on [our] hearts," even for persons who are isolated from any tradition or revelation enabling them to recognize this moral law reflecting the character of God. And part of the idea is that those who are "without the law" (that is, the revealed law as given to Israel) but who honor it as written on their hearts are, in so doing, participating in an ever-deepening positive relationship with God, even if they do not conceptually recognize this. Adapting Thomistic terminology, we might call such relationships "implicit" or "unformed."

When we add to this the traditional understanding that resistance to God can bring entire communities, nations, and cultures into a kind of corporate blindness or "darkness of the understanding," we begin to see that if theism is true, the dimensions of the divine-human relationship may be as rich and mysterious as is the infinitely dimensional God. These deeper dimensions of the divine-human relationship are, it seems to us, relevant to Schellenberg's argument that, necessarily, a theistic God must give all persons an awareness of and belief in God's existence. If reconciliation of broken relationships between two human persons is a complex, multi-dimensional, and downright tricky business, how much more so when one party is the divine Creator, and the other is a geographically and historically diverse human race?

Before completing this thought, it will be useful to note a possible equivocation in Schellenberg's general argument from hiddenness. The argument's two key premises, recall, are that

(P1) Necessarily, God must ensure that each capable non-resistant person is "in a position to participate" in a relation of ever-increasing intimacy with God;

and

(P2) Necessarily, to be "in a position to participate" in a relationship with God requires belief that God exists.

While these premises appear plausible taken individually, our worry is this involves a subtle equivocation in the phrase being "in a position to participate." Consider, first, the second premise. One might see it as nicely reflecting the teaching of Hebrews 11: 6:

For whoever would draw near to God must believe that He exists and rewards those who seek him.

Here the idea -- the Bible's, and Schellenberg's too, we think -- is something like this: one must believe that God exists in order to be in a direct position to draw near to God -- that is, to do so by some basic action that can be undertaken now. (P2) seems most plausible when understood in this sense. However, one can also be said to be "in a position to participate" in a relationship whenever one is in a position to put oneself in a direct position to participate in that relationship. Imagine a son who wants to call his father, but cannot do so directly because the phone line has been cut. Suppose that he does have the knowledge and tools to go outside and repair the damaged line. The son is in an indirect position to participate in the relationship, by virtue of being able to do this preliminary action. Our worry, then, is that (P1) has real plausibility only when "in a position to" is used in this indirect sense.

Furthermore, we worry that Schellenberg here underestimates the possible hidden dimensions in the divine-human relationship. To be sure, Schellenberg recognizes the relevant analogies, noting for example (p. 203) how a loving person will occasionally "stand to one side" to allow autonomy, or even "withdraw for a time to make a point." But he raises such considerations mainly to dismiss their relevance, moving quickly -- too quickly, we think -- to preclude any serious epistemic possibility that a theistic God might, as part of this long-term redemptive project, also have reasons to not make belief an automatic matter. Overall, our worry is then that the considerations he stresses leave open the possibility that the theistic God will ensure that all humans are in an indirect position to participate in a relationship with God, which may include what we have called "implicit" or "unformed" relationships.

It is such considerations, at any rate, that we think need further exploration in evaluating Schellenberg's case. Schellenberg may see them as neglecting his stress on the "infinite resourcefulness" that a theistic God must have. But precisely here the issue is joined, for theists will find him far too quick to read "infinite resourcefulness" in a way that precludes even the possibility that God's redemptive purposes require allowing the features of our world that he counts as virtual proofs of atheism. And if his new atheistic arguments do founder on this point, they fail not only as proofs of atheism but also as reasons for skepticism. For if one's best efforts to find new evidence succeed only in producing arguments that turn out to be badly flawed, this gives one some reason to think that the evidence one already has is rather representative of total evidence.

We want to conclude by affirming the value of the book John Schellenberg has given us. Our sketch of some of his salient arguments does not convey many of its virtues, including his sustained replies to leading philosophers who have raised problems about his earlier work, his sensitivity to the cultural aspects of religiosity, his attention to the complexities of human relationships and to the challenges of personal and spiritual growth. Some of these dimensions are rare indeed in current philosophy. We commend Schellenberg for combining a personal voice with shrewd argument and poignant articulation of a range of considerations that carry much weight for many reflective people today.