2003.07.11

Nagel, Thomas

Concealment and Exposure and Other Essays

Nagel, Thomas, Concealment and Exposure and Other Essays, Oxford University Press, 2002, 256pp, $25.00 (hbk), ISBN 019515293X.

Reviewed by John Gardner, University College, Oxford


n Concealment and Exposure, Thomas Nagel collects eighteen previously published essays of varying length and importance. Most are works of moral and political philosophy, although the final five (which I will not discuss) relate to his other main area of philosophical interest, the relationship between mind and reality. Among the papers in moral and political philosophy, a few might equally be classified as works of cultural commentary, and a couple perhaps even as works of social psychology. Five were published in scholarly books and journals, but the rest appeared in newsstand periodicals such as The New Republic and The London Review of Books (which gives us some reason to be more optimistic about public culture than Nagel is himself). More than half are review articles, mostly, but not only, discussing works by other philosophers.

Ever since his famous 1973 critical notice of Rawls’ A Theory of Justice, Nagel has been the acknowledged master of the philosophical review article. His collection Other Minds (1999) had, and needed, no other raison d’être than to collect together his classic review articles from the previous quarter of a century. In a way Other Minds was a book about the art of criticism in philosophy. Concealment and Exposure has no similar singularity of purpose. Even disregarding the final five essays, the book is eclectic both in what it talks about and in how it talks about it. Nevertheless it is a wonderful book. It is wonderful partly for the further excellent review articles that it adds to the Other Minds archive, and partly for the lively and accessible introduction it provides to Nagel’s own thought and intellectual personality.

Nearly thirty years on, Nagel returns – in two very different essays – to Rawls’ writings. One, written before Rawls’ death but reading like an intellectual obituary, surveys (for a general readership) Rawls’ published work from 1951 to 1999. The Nagel:Rawls page ratio here is 12:1904. One begins to understand how a ten-day coach tour of Europe must feel. Fortunately one is travelling with the world’s number one tour-guide, so one always enjoys the grandest view of the very few things that one gets to see. In the other essay on Rawls, Nagel serves as our topographer. For an informed student readership, he sets about locating Rawls’ two principles of justice in the liberal tradition of political thought. Not just in, I should say, but at the centre of.  A Theory of Justice, for Nagel, lies at the confluence of all of liberalism’s great intellectual rivers.

In both essays, what strikes one most is Nagel’s own sense of belonging to the landscapes through which he guides us. He is an unapologetic liberal, and a proud son of the Rawlsian enlightenment. Several of the other essays in the book, not billed as writings about Rawls, nevertheless exhibit Nagel’s profound loyalty to the general tenor of the original Rawlsian project. And yet the essays also testify to various doubts, difficulties, and differences of opinion. I will mention a few.

1. The separateness of persons. Nagel shares Rawls’ commitment to the deontological aspect of justice. What is just is not just because it is worth doing. Rather it is worth doing because it is just. In matters of justice the right, as Rawls put it, is prior to the good. Rawls thought that it follows that justice has an agent-relative aspect, affecting the extent to which one person can justly be sacrificed for the sake of others. Nagel appreciates that this does not follow. Amartya Sen, Derek Parfit, Joseph Raz and others have argued that it is more natural to interpret deontological principles agent-neutrally. If the fact that an action treats someone justly makes it worth doing, then aren’t two such actions always more worth doing than one? So shouldn’t I treat someone unjustly if thereby I can make it the case that two other people will not be treated (similarly) unjustly, whether by myself or another? This obviously doesn’t make the treatment just, but doesn’t it make it a justifiable injustice? In his review of Raz’s Ethics in the Public Domain (1994) Nagel sides with Rawls and against Raz in denying this conclusion. But strangely his reasons for doing so still seem only to support the existence of agent-neutral deontological principles (which Raz accepts) not agent-relative ones. In his review of Scanlon’s What We Owe to Each Other (1998) Nagel tries to bring out the merit in Scanlon’s contractarian defence of agent-relativity, but again he seems to turn it into no more than a defence of agent-neutral deontology. One needs to turn to Nagel’s splendid essay ’Personal Rights and Public Space’ to find any authentically agent-relative thoughts. Here Nagel endorses Frances Kamm’s answer on behalf of agent-relativity: ’not only is it an evil for a person to be harmed in certain ways, but for it to be permissible to harm the person in those ways is an additional and independent evil’ (38). One may doubt whether this argument succeeds (the claim made by the agent-neutralist is not one of permissibility but of justifiability). But at least the argument, unlike those invoked by Nagel in discussing Raz and Scanlon, does have agent-relative implications if it does succeed. If successful it yields an agent-neutral value that can only be served through agent-relative constraints (by maximising the number of people of whom it is true that it is impermissible to harm them even to minimise the number of people that are harmed).

2. Equality and luck. Nagel thinks of himself and of Rawls as egalitarians. But in the more fined-grained classification introduced by Derek Parfit, he and Rawls really count as ’prioritarians’. They both think that in a world of scarcity the position of the worse-off should have priority for improvement. But they see no reason to spoil the position of the better-off except to secure such improvement. Unlike strict egalitarians they do not think that the fact that wheelchair-bound people cannot enter certain public toilets is a reason to close those toilets without replacement (126). But they might well think that builders of new public toilets should give priority, all else being equal, to making them wheelchair-accessible (on the ground that the wheelchair-bound have fewer toilet facilities than others). Rawls was animated in his prioritarianism by what might be called the ’social insurance’ objective: protect people from disadvantage that is no fault of their own. Nagel shares this objective. But in his 1996 H.L.A. Hart lecture ’Justice and Nature’ he clarifies its relationship to justice. Rawls quickly concluded from the fact that disadvantage is not the fault of the person who experiences it that it should, in justice, be collectively borne. Nagel has come to think that this is too quick: there must be an intervening step in which the disadvantage is found to be the fault of society instead, leaving a range of ’natural’ disadvantages which are nobody’s fault and which justice does not require anyone to remedy (even if they should sometimes still be remedied on other grounds, e.g. in the name of decency). The intervening step is needed, thinks Nagel, to respect justice’s deontological structure: it is not disadvantage as such that justice abhors, but the unjust infliction or toleration of it by someone. Nature, thinks Nagel, cannot be that someone. Of course one may always argue that the someone in question is someone who had the duty to furnish what nature denied. Nagel does not doubt this. He merely suspects, pace Rawls, that we cannot by-pass the need to identify that someone before we can think of a disadvantage under the heading of justice.

3. The priority of justice. The challenge encapsulated in the title of G.A. Cohen’s If You’re an Egalitarian How Come You’re so Rich? (2000) makes Nagel pause to ask whether he really is an egalitarian. I have just given a reason to doubt whether he is. But Cohen’s challenge can be generalised to apply to prioritarians as well. Many relatively well-off people think that we live in an unjust society or an unjust world. They think that it would be a more just world if they themselves were made less well-off in order to make some worse-off people better-off. They regard it as a scandal that the government doesn’t require them, and others like them, to sacrifice more for the good of others. Yet they do not regard it as a scandal that they, and others like them, fail to make the same sacrifice without being required by the government to do so. Do they have a defensible moral position? Rawls leaves room for one by defending a division of moral labour: the actions that make an individual just are different from those that make a social institution just; besides, social institutions should give priority to being just whereas individuals need not. But Nagel seems to rule out such a division of moral labour with his more sweeping prioritization of justice: ’to appeal to it is to claim priority over other values’ (113). No wonder, then, that Nagel feels tested to the limit by Cohen’s challenge, whereas many Rawlsian readers are simply baffled by it. (As one who does not think that even social institutions should give priority to being just, I feel its force even less.)

4. Public culture. Nagel’s sensitivity to Cohen’s challenge may also reflect a shared appreciation of the relative impotence of the liberal state in the face of an inhospitable public culture. While Cohen emphasises self-indulgence and hypocrisy as obstacles to our living at ease with ourselves, Nagel emphasises prurience and judgmentalism. Contemporary culture’s erosion of the division between public and private life – an erosion thought by Nagel to be oppressive – is a theme of the first few essays in the volume, most interestingly the title essay. This is where Nagel’s work drifts furthest away from its Rawlsian roots, both in style and in preoccupations. It reminds one more of Mill. It cautions against ’confrontation in the public space over different attitudes about the conduct of personal life’ (25), and offers ’an anticommunitarian vision of civility’ (26) in which liberal-minded people do not make it their programme to replace people’s illiberal private attitudes with liberal ones by permeating the culture with liberal moralising (anti-racist, pro-gay, etc.) but rather concentrate on leaving people’s private attitudes well alone. This claim is rather undertheorised until Nagel links it with Kamm’s modest agent-relativism, which he presents in support of a kind of citadel of the soul, not amenable to public moral scrutiny or sacrifice. Gradually he also ties the same idea in with gender politics, on which he proves himself a sensitive and balanced commentator. What might have struck some feminists as an alarming throwback to a discredited public-private distinction turns out to be nothing of the kind. Like Mill, Nagel appreciates that appeals to privacy are a double-edged sword and have been used to mask grotesque abuses as well as more subtle methods of disempowerment. He is no reactionary who longs for a reversal of the sexual revolution, and he has no time for the risible Stepford Wives nostalgia of Wendy Shalit’s Chastity (1999), a short review of which is also reprinted here. As we know from his bruising encounter with Cohen, Nagel offers no hiding-place for privately-inflicted injustices. He merely warns today’s sexual Zapatistas (and the Clinton-baiting tabloid journalists who are their unexpected and unwanted bedfellows) against the opposite excess of an impoverishment of human sexuality by casual disrespect for the boundaries of intimacy.

5. Sex as social construct. It is in the domain of sexuality that several of Nagel’s themes converge. His remarks on human sexual life, at various points in the book, exhibit a tenderness and a subtlety that suit the subject-matter as well endearing one to their author. He resists dogmatic simplification and does not fear being intellectually unfashionable. In his otherwise sympathetic review of Martha Nussbaum’s Sex and Social Justice (1999), for example, he takes issue with Nussbaum’s lurking affection for the excessively boiled-down idea that sexual relations are socially constructed. Not all differences between men and women in matters of sexuality should instantly be interpreted as symptoms of acculturation, and hence as tainted by the pervasively and persistently unjust treatment of women. Human beings are also animals with bodies, doing their animal stuff with their bodies. Anatomy is not destiny but nor is it without influence. This idea helps to lay the groundwork for the argument, central to ’Justice and Nature’, that – from the point of view of justice – we need to concentrate on putting right the unjust things that we have done with natural difference, rather than trying to compensate for natural difference itself, even where the natural difference is itself differentially advantageous. That only women can give birth is not an injustice. That they are fired from their jobs for it is.

Such familiar Rawlsian preoccupations are never far from our minds as we read this book. Through everything Nagel still stands up for the classic Rawlsian conception of the political: ’The important battles are about how people are required to treat each other, how social and economic institutions are to be arranged, and how public resources are to be used’ (26). And yet Nagel also insists, in a way that is unusual among today’s political philosophers, that these are not the limits of inquiry. He wants us to understand how the intensely personal aspects of human life – even our fantasy life – can engage with, and yet at the same time resist, the tentacles of justice. The result is that the essays in this volume, taken together, do more than any other philosophical writings known to me to bring out the complex and treacherous truth in the old maxim that the personal is political.