2008.07.18

Steve Fuller

The Knowledge Book: Key Concepts in Philosophy

Steve Fuller, The Knowledge Book: Key Concepts in Philosophy, Science and Culture, McGill-Queen's University Press, 2007, 222pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773533479.

Reviewed by Val Dusek, University of New Hampshire


Steve Fuller's work is in the format of Raymond Williams' Keywords, Elizabeth Fox Keller and Elizabeth Lloyd's Keywords in Evolutionary Biology, and, more recently -- and aptly -- Cary Nelson's Keywords in Academia: A Devil's Dictionary for Higher Education. The work contains forty-two succinct entries, averaging four to six pages long, on a number of notions of relevance to science studies. It contains, for instance, under P: Philosophy versus sociology, Postmodernism, and Progress; under R: Rationality, Relativism versus constructivism, Religion, and Rhetoric. The entries are extensively cross-referenced. The work was originally published in Japan, where there are a number of skilled interpreters of Fuller's social epistemology.

Fuller's background is different from that of most philosophers of science and constructivist sociologists of scientific knowledge, which may in part account for the great originality of his approach. Most philosophers of science and sociologists of scientific knowledge started out as science majors or scientists and because of either impatience with drudgery in the lab, or difficulty of the mathematics, combined with deepening fascination with the epistemological issues, shifted into philosophy. The more cynical would claim that many philosophers, historians, and sociologists of scientific knowledge are simply failed scientists. Fuller, in contrast, was a double major in history and sociology as a Columbia undergraduate. He then studied History and Philosophy of Science at Cambridge and at Pittsburgh. Fuller's work is socially and historically richer by far than that of most philosophers and far more philosophically sophisticated than that of other sociologists (even those with philosophical training).

Fuller's breadth of reading in the humanities and social sciences is astounding. He is knowledgeable about sociology, social history, anthropology, psychology, and a bit of economics, particularly development economics. He also has extensive familiarity with the literature of law, theology, rhetoric, history, philosophy, history of science, literary criticism, library science, political science, organizational behavior, and many other fields. He deploys his learning with wit and panache in an endlessly ironical dialectic. The one field in which he is weak is actual natural science. This weakness is compensated by his breadth of knowledge of sociology, and social, economic, and general intellectual history which he deploys while doing philosophy of science far more extensive than that of any philosopher with whom I am acquainted. Nevertheless, his lack of contact with science in the raw (as opposed to high quality popular science and philosophically or historically digested and processed science) leads to some weaknesses in his accounts.

One question arising is that of the intended audience of the work. It could be an introduction to key concepts for students and those curious about science studies. One blurb by Stephen Turner characterizes the work as a "devil's dictionary." One may wonder whether a devil's dictionary, sharing the cynicism of Ambrose Bierce concerning the received knowledge in the field, would be appropriate as an introduction for students. Some ordinary language philosophers complained that they first had to inculcate in students the intellectual diseases that a dose of Wittgenstein or Gilbert Ryle could cure. Similarly students new to philosophy and history of science would miss the ironies in the work at hand, being ignorant of the received views that Fuller is debunking. Furthermore, although the alphabetical thumbnail sketches give a survey of numerous central topics, quite a few of them are from such a biased and particular viewpoint (albeit with biases openly admitted, and with a stimulating and provocative take) that the work could hardly serve as a general textbook "survey." Another more appropriate characterization is as a "Fullerite" introduction to science studies. The work might serve as a handbook for prospective Fuller followers, many perhaps converted from the (purportedly) destructive and misleading Cold War ideology of Thomas Kuhn to the Fullerian approach. For those more familiar with mainline science studies and/or philosophy and history of science the work also serves as the source of an endlessly illuminating, entertaining, ironic, and critical set of apercus.

Similarly the reading lists appended to each entry are somewhat peculiar. Although Fuller refers to numerous classics of philosophy and sociology in the text, he gives no detailed references to them in the text, citing only last name, title and date. (First names of some do appear in the index.) Major figures mentioned in the text, such as Hume and Hilbert, do not even appear in the index. Kuhn also does not appear in the index, despite frequent reference to him, but this may be an intentional omission. Major figures discussed (such as Darwin, Duhem, Durkheim, to cite just some whose last names begin with D) are not cited at the end of entries. The sources explicitly cited in the bibliographies at the end of entries are frequently surveys, such as Raymond Aron’s on the "classical" figures in sociological theory, Ernst Cassirer and J. T. Merz on nineteenth century philosophy and science, and the usual suspects in science studies and postmodern thought. Fuller's choice of surveys are generally very good. (I think, for instance, that Aron is an excellent choice if one is forced to choose a single work on the "classical" sociological theorists of the nineteenth and early twentieth centuries.) However it seems odd that budding science studies devotees are not referred to the relevant works of the earlier twentieth century social theorists Durkheim, Weber, Pareto, and Gramsci, all mentioned in various entries (let alone the most important earlier philosophers and historians of science, such as Hume and Duhem).

If we read this as an introduction to Fuller's take on social epistemology and related matters it is a very concise and useful summary. Fuller's approach is superior to both analytic social epistemology and post-modern science studies. In contrast to analytic social epistemology, Fuller's version is more genuinely social, historical, and collective. It does not base itself on the highly individualistic models often used by the analytical social epistemologists. In contrast to mainstream science studies, Fuller's work is explicitly normative and evaluative. Its role is one of improving the management and investment of resources in science in the interest of society and democracy. Fuller has come more and more to ally his views with those of Karl Popper against the uncritical acceptance of science and the scientific community status quo among the followers of Kuhn. In two other works Fuller has unfavorably compared Kuhn's complacency with the critical and normative, evaluative approach of Popper. Fuller, needless to say, disassociates himself from the residual formalism of the early Popper as well as the animus against the sociology of knowledge in general that Popper and Hayek hold. Fuller criticizes the exemption of science from social analysis by the early Karl Mannheim, as well as the uncritical acceptance of the professed norms of science as the actual behavior of scientists by Merton. Fuller notes that in religion or politics Merton's approach would be equivalent to accepting the statements of religious leaders and politicians at face value, rather than examining the social function of the actual religious and political movements. Fuller compares the "low church" style of social epistemology that he advocates to the "high church" style. He compares contemporary sociology of scientific knowledge to Biblical Higher Criticism, subjecting the sacred texts of science to cynical debunking without directly advocating change in the institutions of the church. Fuller advocates the "secularization" of science, analogous to the seventeenth century development wherein states refused to grant a single religion social and economic monopoly. This idea of the "disestablishment of science" was earlier advocated, somewhat idealistically, by Jacob Bronowski in Encounter (J. Bronowski, 'The Disestablishment of Science', Encounter (July 1971), 9-16), and also advocated, unrealistically, by Michael Polanyi. Fuller tends to play down his predecessors in this area, perhaps to emphasize his own originality. He certainly develops this idea with a greater thoroughness and strategic realism than did either Bronowski or Polanyi.

Fuller's work is full of original and fascinating connections of the views and biographies of scientists, philosophers, and sociologists with the social and political circumstances of their work. He constantly surprises by finding connections to social and political motivations and enabling conditions for the rise and spread of even the most abstract and apparently apolitical concepts. Fuller also constantly ties views about science to the training, background, and larger social setting of the view’s author. For instance Fuller notes how the phenomenologist Alfred Schutz wrote an article that was a precursor by at least forty years of writings on the knowledge society and information society that stemmed from Schutz's participation with later-to-be post-capitalist management theorist Peter Drucker in a seminar led by Friedrich Hayek.

Fuller debunks and deconstructs the usual accounts of the epistemic legitimations of science in terms of truth, realism, and progress in order to develop a political legitimation of science. (Francis Remedios is particularly helpful in explicating Fuller's political legitimation of science and comparing it to the epistemological legitimations by traditional philosophers and analytical social epistemologists as well as the rejection of global justification by Joe Rouse and others. See Remedios' Legitimizing Scientific Knowledge: An Introduction to Steve Fuller's Social Epistemology¸ Lanham, MD: Lexington Books, 2003.)

Fuller is an instrumentalist with respect to natural science and a realist with respect to social science. Like the sociologists of scientific knowledge, he debunks the claims that truth and objectivity is achieved by natural science. One area where Fuller's debunking of the traditional views is particularly well worked out and effective is his critique of scientific progress. He uses the concept of "adaptive preferences" along lines developed by Jon Elster. In what Elster calls cases of "sweet lemons" (the opposite of “sour grapes”), one re-interprets unintended and perhaps discouraging results of a research program as having results towards which the program had always been directed. Perhaps an ambitious research program that originally aimed at ultimate reality and generality succeeded only by narrowing its scope to a rigorous and precise treatment of a relatively irrelevant detail, but this specialized success comes to be portrayed as the original overall goal. In contrast to the claims to objectivity and truth achieved by the natural sciences, Fuller legitimates natural science in terms of a theory of civic republicanism. Fuller does believe there is a demarcation between science and the rest of culture. Those sympathetic to the cultural studies of science, such as Rouse, deny there is such a demarcation, claiming, in Rorty’s words, that "natural science is not a natural kind." However, Fuller's demarcation is institutional, not logical. Fuller, unlike many institutional demarcationists, wishes to open up science to participation and contribution by those in the community at large. In both holding to demarcation and wishing to make science a more open society, Fuller is like the left Popperians.

One area in which the peculiarity (and perhaps perversity) of Fuller's views is evident is the entry on evolution. Fuller has received notoriety for his appearance at the Dover, Pennsylvania trial on the teaching of Intelligent Design (ID) in public schools. Fuller's testimony on the side of the Designers is not simply a grasp for publicity and media coverage. Fuller for decades has argued that inclusion of divine creation within biology would sustain the motivation of many students whose fascination with biology is dampened by the elimination from the biology curriculum of religious awe at creation. Perhaps he is right, although this alone would not be sufficient to justify defense of intelligent design as a core concept in biological science.

One can defend the teaching of ID on the basis of radically democratic and populist conceptions of local control of education. After all, if either patriotically adulterated or politically correct American history can be demanded (and instituted) in local public school curricula, why not ID? Fuller, however, has gone further and defended ID as a "new paradigm" in one TV (NOVA) sound bite. (This is ironic, given Fuller's low opinion of Kuhn.) As Philip Kitcher, among many others, has pointed out, ID is a very old (and superseded) paradigm in biological science. Today ID partisans make criticisms of natural selection (the best of which are borrowed and distorted from anti-selectionist evolutionists such as Conrad Waddington, Steve Gould, and Richard Lewontin) but do not make positive explanatory proposals other than the amorphous "A designer did it."

Fuller's treatment of evolution avoids discussing ID. The "Evolution" entry shows the broad conception of evolution within the social sciences, including virtually any kind of change as evolution. A good deal of attention is given to Nietzsche and Foucault. (Foucault would be very unlikely to consider himself an evolutionist in history of ideas.) Given Fuller's sympathy for and frequent reference to Popper in the work, one might think a discussion of Popper's rather mixed views pro and con Darwinian evolution would be included, but they are not. Perhaps Fuller's sympathy for Popper extends only to his normative side. "Hopeful monsters" are associated with Donna Haraway, but not with Goldschmidt or Gould, and Freud is asserted to have applied Nietzsche's genealogical method. Nietzsche is credited with the pun on Haeckel's "ontogeny recapitulates phylogeny" as "ontology recapitulates philology." (Fuller repeats elsewhere the attribution of this pun to Nietzsche, which Quine in the motto of Word and Object attributes to the biologist and psychotherapist James Grier Miller.) One cannot tell whether these references are coyly ironic or are the result of genuine misconceptions. Either way they are misleading to the naïve or beginning reader. Fuller's reading list on evolution contains only three fairly standard accounts of biological evolution in relation to the social sciences, but includes ten other much less typical works, including several of Haraway, and one each of Foucault and Deleuze.

Critics of those who advocate the criticism and management of science by use of external, social criteria often trot out the horror stories of Nazi race science and Stalinist, Lysenkoist genetics. Indeed, these historical examples of politicized science are what in large part motivated Merton's idealized version of the norms of science and his retreat from the more historical and social analysis of science of his earliest work. In reply to the challenge based on Nazi and Stalinist genetics, defenders of the political evaluation of science note that contemporary science is driven and directed largely by considerations of real or imagined military application (in the case of mid-twentieth century physics) or by corporate profit (the latter as currently most obvious in biomedical and pharmaceutical research). However, the dangers and distortions of science are manifest in such relatively benign external directives to science as those of Nixon's "war on cancer." Moreover, the difficulties and risks of this sort of social evaluation of the direction of science are present in Fuller's own unfortunate choice of an area of political and legal intervention by the social epistemologist in his defense of the Intelligent Design movement. Here, I think Fuller's lack of involvement with hands-on practice of science is a detriment.

Fuller's approach in this area reminds me of Jeremy Rifkin who (although largely self taught and far less scholarly than Fuller) similarly combines in his book Algeny a quite good popularization of views of Robert Young, Silvain Schweber, and others on the social and economic context of Darwin's creation of natural selection in one chapter with a grossly uncritical acceptance of creationist claims in another.

There are plenty of "populist" and disparaged movements of "alternative science" that Fuller might have defended without uncritically allying himself with such politically authoritarian (theocratic) and socially regressive forces. These include everything from Bohmian mechanics to purported herbal remedies that are not funded for scientific evaluation because of lack of profits for big pharmaceutical companies even to Duesberg's denial that HIV causes AIDS (which is at least based on his genuine expertise and data in the relevant area of retroviruses, despite its unsavory supporters among South African AIDS deniers). It is unfortunate that Fuller made the choice that he did.

However, just as the ideals of the 1930s Marxists (J. D. Bernal, J. B. S. Haldane, et al.) of public education and participation in science as well as emphasis on broad social utility of science for the vast majority of the population are laudable ones, and are not ipso facto discredited by the later debacle of Lysenkoism, so Fuller's normative directives for evaluation of scientific projects in terms of public interest and utility will not be refuted by his political misstep of aligning with the Intelligent Design movement. However, the alliance will unfortunately be easily used by many defenders of the scientific status quo to discredit the admirable civic republican ideal of science that Fuller presents.