Christopher Shields


Christopher Shields, Aristotle, Routledge, 2007, 456pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415283328.

Reviewed by Barbara Sattler, Yale University

It is rare to be asked about a new publication in ancient philosophy by colleagues from outside the history of philosophy. This has happened to me twice with Shields' book which seems to indicate that his introduction to Aristotle has already attracted quite some interest -- one reason is probably that Shields' presentation focuses on philosophical problems that are interesting also for a contemporary philosopher. Shields' conception of his book becomes most obvious in contrast to Ross's well-known Aristotle (1923): While Ross gives us a synopsis of every chapter of a work of Aristotle, Shields picks out some central problems and frequently connects them with contemporary philosophical debates, as when he points out both differences and common features between Aristotle's essentialism and modern modal views (p. 105). What one might miss in Shields is an attempt to give us a sketch of the overall project of a whole work of Aristotle's and an explicit indication of the works that Shields does not discuss at all in this introduction, among others, Aristotle's numerous biological works.

But this is in accord with the task Shields has set himself for his charmingly written book: "to motivate the principal features of Aristotle's philosophy" (p. 1), mostly not by sketching the debate current in Aristotle's time, but rather by showing how Aristotle reacts to certain general philosophical problems. For this Shields uses simple but delightful examples that are close to the modern mind without, for the most part, distorting Aristotle's thought. This danger Shields avoids in two ways. Firstly, he takes seriously not only the problems a contemporary reader might have with Aristotle's account, but also the answers Aristotle might give to such objections. Secondly, Shields quotes plenty of passages from various works of Aristotle, which are not used merely as references but usually prudently interpreted and followed by a lucid logical analysis. Never does Shields give a collection of quotes that are merely connected by paraphrases, as can, e.g., sometimes be found in Ackrill's Aristotle the Philosopher (1981).

Shields' presentation of Aristotle is, like Ross's Aristotle book, structured along the lines of Aristotle's division of the sciences: Starting with what he treats as the basic equipment, or organon, of Aristotle's whole philosophy, Shields moves on to the theoretical sciences from among which he selects natural philosophy, metaphysics and psychology for discussion; he continues with the practical sciences of ethics and politics, and the productive sciences of rhetoric and poetics; he moves on to a short sketch of Aristotle's legacy in modern times, focusing on contemporary functionalism and virtue ethics; and he finishes off the book with a glossary of Aristotle's key philosophical terms. Every chapter comes with a conclusion and -- a standard feature of this introductory series from Routledge -- with references to the Aristotelian passages to read as well as recommended secondary literature.

Shields' organon can be understood as comprising the first four chapters which lay the basis for his attempt to show us Aristotle as a "highly systematic thinker, such that his view in one field cannot often be fully understood without frequent recourse to his views in another" (p. 3) -- an honourable undertaking. The main elements that Shields takes as the basis for understanding the Aristotelian corpus are the four-cause-schema, his hylomorphism and the theory of categories. While the first chapter gives an overview of the life and work of Aristotle -- some might miss a proper Platonic background here which is added partly in some later chapters, but missing, e.g., in the account of Aristotle's Politics -- the fourth chapter focuses on the last mentioned framework, on the Categories. Given the systematicity claim in the background, some effort is put into a discussion of a possible grounding for Aristotle's categories -- presenting basic strands in the secondary literature that treat the categories either as underived but founded, e.g., in common sense, or else as derived, e.g. from the Antepraedicamenta. This clear overview of possible ways to react to Kant's famous accusation that there is no justification for the specific set of Aristotle's categories is one of many lucid sketches of important interpretative debates that Shields gives, often without himself taking sides, a task which he leaves, rightly, to the reader.

Unfortunately, however, Shields starts this overview with an impenetrable account of the categories of quantity and quality. To distinguish the category of quantity from that of substance he puts forward this example: "Socrates weighs 67.5 kilos. His weight describes a quantity of matter, where a quantity is unlike Socrates, because in itself it is indeterminate, but also unlike a quality, because it is not shareable" (p. 160). It is left unexplained why weighing 67.5 kilos is "in itself indeterminate" and why it is "not shareable" as a quality like white is. Not that a reader would fail to understand the difference between quantity and quality. But this she would do because of her everyday understanding of these terms, not because of Shields' account. And when later on Shields wants to situate time within the categorical framework, it would have been instructive to tell the reader why he subsumes it under the category of quantity without even mentioning the category of "when" introduced earlier.

The extensive chapters 2 and 3 deal with what Shields considers to be Aristotle's general explanatory framework: The four causes and the "tools and methods required for successful philosophizing", like dialectic and the distinction between univocity and homonymy. Here, for the first time, we encounter a problem with Shields' book that occurs repeatedly: he fails to distinguish properly conception and reality in a way that would do justice to the ancients. Shields wants to understand the four causes as providing the necessary and sufficient conditions for adequacy in explanation, and in this very function to be "processes rather than static events" (p. 47). Understanding the conditions of adequate explanation as processes, however, seems to confuse what is described -- real things that can be understood as causes -- with the description: the four causes qua respects under which something is described can hardly be understood as physical processes. And Shields seems to overlook the fact that explanatory adequacy also requires a first starting point when he explains Aristotle's claim that a chain of demonstrations cannot continue to infinity due to the fact that we are finite in time (p. 113). Aristotle would probably see most of the gods as no less in intellectual trouble with an infinite chain of demonstrations since without a starting point for such a chain no explanatory basis could be reached for him independent of the time available to the inquirer.

Aristotle's hylomorphism is introduced in the second chapter in a familiar way, as a reaction to Parmenides. However, the set up of this challenge again leads to a confusion of conceptualisation and reality. For Shields characterizes Parmenides' argument only vaguely as claiming that change is impossible and thus prepares the way for switching unconsciously between understanding Parmenides as rejecting the intelligibility of change -- change cannot be thought -- and as denying the possibility of experiencing change. The latter claims the non-existence of change within our empirical world while the former only denies its accessibility to philosophical conceptualisation. Why Aristotle introduces matter and form in order to be able to react to this Parmenidean problem doesn't become entirely clear in Shields' account. This connection could get a more transparent treatment, as can, e.g., be seen in Lear's introduction Aristotle: The Desire to Understand (1988). And if Aristotle had indeed argued from the existence of change to the existence of matter and form as Shields believes (p. 56), rather than claiming matter and form as the conceptual tools that can show change as being intelligible and thus amenable to philosophical treatment, Parmenides' challenge would not have been met.

Looking at Shields' chapter on Aristotle's natural philosophy as an example of his treatment of Aristotle's theoretical sciences, one might be disappointed that he concentrates only on a selection of puzzles from the Physics. One might miss Aristotle's cosmology and meteorology as well as an account of the connection between these treatises which form what Aristotle understands by physics in his division of the sciences. However, given the restricted space and Shields' principal approach, his selection of issues is indeed very prudent as they present central problems in Aristotle's natural philosophy and thus provide the basic orientation for discussion of this realm.

Unfortunately, the problematic confusion between concept and reality seems to show up again in this chapter in the discussion of Aristotle's notion of time:

If time is a measure of change in respect of before and after, then a necessary condition of there being time at all is the existence of change. A question of adequacy thus presents itself: is time not possible without change? If so, then Aristotle's definition fails. (p. 215)

The first proposition is presented by Shields (correctly) as Aristotle's definition of time. The only way I can thus read the supposed challenge to Aristotle is by understanding the question of adequacy as the question whether Aristotle does in fact assume that time is not possible without change. Why, if this is indeed Aristotle's position, the position fails, Shields does not explain. Perhaps Shields understands time as a measure along the lines of a yardstick and thus expects time to exist independently of change, in the way that the yardstick exists separately from the things measured by it. If so, then he had better check his understanding of time as a measure in Aristotle again. Shields' reference in a footnote to Shoemaker's article "Time without Change" can hardly count as sufficient evidence for the independent existence of time. Not only is it unclear that Shoemaker actually succeeds in his account of time without change; the more important point is that, in order to decide whether or not a definition fails, we must consider the framework within which it was developed and fulfils a certain function, or fails to do so. This is not to deny that today we have conceptual frameworks within physics which provide for the possibility of time without change, only to disclaim that referring to our physical notion of time today is enough for assessing Aristotle's definition.

Such an assessment is impeded by the fact that Shields does not really clarify the relationship between time and change in Aristotle. Shields rightly takes up and uses Aristotle's distinction between time and change: there is a myriad of changes but just one time (p. 212). But then he seems to forget about this distinction between time as a measure in general and the many different changes whose duration is measured two pages later:

[W]e are able to speak of two stretches of time as being the same (each year takes the same time). This notion is familiar enough, but requires some sort of abstraction from Aristotle's defined notion, which ties each time to an individual change. Probably something can be done along these lines, but it is a non-trivial matter, given Aristotle's conception of mathematical abstraction. (p. 214)

Shields seems to run together several points in this investigation: from the fact that each motion takes time he seems to infer that Aristotle has to assume a plurality of times without taking into account that all motions can be brought under a common measure, namely that provided by the motions of the sun, and they therefore all belong to a single time. Bringing them all under one measure, however, has nothing to do with mathematical abstraction but is simply the application, to any given motion, of the temporal units provided by the motions of the heavens. Finally, Shields' point that "each year takes the same time" doesn't show that we are dealing with two different times, but only that the year as the basic measurement unit can be used to measure and compare different changes (and obviously this basic unit has to be taken as constant).

Independently of such single weaknesses (which can hardly be avoided in such a broad overview) one has to appreciate Shields' consistent sticking to his basic approach, which can also be seen in his treatment of the practical sciences, and in particular the Nicomachean Ethics. Again, he picks out central points of the work in order to mark the broad frame within which the problems of Aristotle's ethics are discussed: why we can assume one final end for human beings, how to understand happiness as such a final end, how to understand Aristotle's idea of a human function that determines this end, and how to determine Aristotle's conception of the aretê of our rational soul the expression of which is the human good. Two seemingly more peripheral issues, Aristotle's notion of friendship and of akrasia, get discussed as possible replies to potential objections: friendship to point out that Aristotle's eudaimonic ethic is not egoistic, as the focus on human happiness might suggest, and akrasia in order to show how the rational and the non-rational facets of our soul may come into conflict. Shields confirms the systematic character of Aristotle's thought by showing how the notion of virtue and the human good is based on the essentialism in Aristotle's metaphysics, and his specific differentiation between the rational and the non-rational parts of the soul on his psychology. And the whole teleological structure of a final good for human beings Shields sketches as ultimately based on Aristotle's four-causal account.

Shields' problem-based approach will make the book well-accessible to philosophers unfamiliar with the ancient world. However, these readers might be a bit obstructed by a few "technical" problems. Shields doesn't always indicate the passages in Aristotle on which he draws for his reconstruction of an Aristotelian argument (cf., e.g., p. 112). And on pp. 216-217 he unfortunately gives the impression that parts of Par­meni­des' fragment 8 could be found in the sixth book of Aristotle's Physics. While most of the footnotes provide simple cross-references between chapters allowing the reader to jump easily within the book, they have to be read quite carefully. For sometimes a crucial part of an explanation, as, e.g., of Aristotle's to ti ên einai, or even the explanation itself, is to be found in a note (e.g., the difference between necessity de dicto and de re is well explicated in a footnote while the explanation in the main text is a bit confusing, cf. pp. 107-108).

Finally, there is the well-known problem of current publishing methods -- a large number of typos. Most of these typos are merely irritating. some, however, hamper the understanding, and the creative extension of line numbers in Aristotle's work to the hundreds will make looking up passages for the new reader of Aristotle a more challenging enterprise. The bibliography names Isaac Newton as the author of the article on Aristotle's political theory in the on-line Stanford Encyclopaedia of Philosophy -- though I rather doubt that Newton has come back to us in the guise of Fred Miller to write this entry.

Overall, however, Shields has written a very readable and helpful guide to Aristotle. It is not necessarily an introduction for the average beginner, but rather for readers already experienced in philosophy -- as the enquiries about the book from colleagues in other areas of philosophy confirm. But I don't think that this is a bad thing. After all, surprising as this may seem, it is not simply god-given -- nor even in fact given at all -- that every philosopher has some knowledge of Aristotle. And it is for this general philosophical audience that Shields, on the whole, does a wonderful job.