2008.08.04

Yujin Nagasawa

God and Phenomenal Consciousness: A Novel Approach to Knowledge Arguments

Yujin Nagasawa, God and Phenomenal Consciousness: A Novel Approach to Knowledge Arguments, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 162pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521879668.

Reviewed by Uwe Meixner, University of Regensburg


In the philosophy of mind, Frank Jackson's famous Mary Argument is also known as the Knowledge Argument. More appropriately, perhaps, one might have called it the No Knowledge Argument, for Jackson's thought experiment attempts to demonstrate the non-physicalness of phenomenal consciousness by pointing out (with respect to the envisaged scenario) that at a certain time in her career Mary has no knowledge of certain aspects of phenomenal consciousness, whereas, at that same time, she has complete knowledge of the physical world.

In Nagasawa's book, this well-known knowledge argument of the philosophy of mind is connected with less-known other knowledge arguments (as Nagasawa calls them), namely, with certain atheological arguments in the field of the philosophy of religion, arguments which attempt to demonstrate the non-existence of God by pointing out that God's omniscience is incompatible with His other traditional perfections (where, of course, it is presupposed that the possession of all traditional divine perfections is necessary for the existence of God). Again, these other knowledge arguments might have been more appropriately called no knowledge arguments, for they typically try to show that God, given His other traditional divine perfections, must have no knowledge of something or other, and must therefore lack omniscience (hence existence).

Making a connection between the prototypical (No) Knowledge Argument and the atheological (no) knowledge arguments is not as far-fetched and artificial as one might think at first sight. Remember that the assertion of Mary's lack of knowledge regarding certain aspects of phenomenal consciousness is regarded (by proponents of the argument) as being justified by pointing out that she has not had certain experiences (given the black-and-white environment she lives in), the crucial presupposition being that without those experiences she cannot in any other way acquire that knowledge. Analogously, one might argue (and Nagasawa dedicates two chapters of the eight chapters of his book -- Chapters 3 and 4 -- to examining the argument in detail) that God does not fully comprehend the concept of fear (and therefore is not omniscient) because -- given His omnipotence -- He has not experienced fear, the crucial presupposition this time being that without the experience of fear God cannot in any other way fully comprehend the concept of fear.

How does Nagasawa position himself with regard to the Knowledge Argument and with regard to the atheological argument I just described -- let me call it "the Atheological Knowledge Argument" (Nagasawa calls it "the Argument from Concept Possession")? On p. 124, he casts the arguments in the following two parallel forms (my presentation is slightly simplified):

The Knowledge Argument:

M = P.

M is a proper subset of T.

Therefore: P is a proper subset of T -- contradicting physicalism, which requires P = T.

The Atheological Knowledge Argument:

G = D.

G is a proper subset of T.

Therefore: D is a proper subset of T -- contradicting traditional theism, which requires D = T.

Here, M is the set of propositions that Mary knows, G the set of propositions that God actually knows, P the set of true physical propositions, D the set of true propositions that God can (in fact) know, and T the set of true propositions.

With regard to the Atheological Knowledge Argument in the above set-theoretical form, Nagasawa states (ibid.) that its first premise is uncontroversially true. In saying this, Nagasawa seems to overlook that the argument is supposed to be an atheological argument (and, moreover, does not have the form of a reductio ad absurdum); if its first premise were true, it would not fulfill this purpose (nor would it do so, of course, if that premise were false). It is quite true that "G = D" simply means that God knows everything true that He can know (p. 124-125; Nagasawa omits the word "true," which I believe had better be inserted). But if the set D is non-empty -- and how could it not be non-empty since it is supposed to be "the set of all true propositions such that their being known is consistent with necessary divine attributes" (p. 124)?[1] -- , then the set G is non-empty too (in the presence of the, allegedly, uncontroversial truth "G = D"), and therefore God knows some proposition -- which surely means that He exists, does it not?

Thus, the Atheological Knowledge Argument -- in the form Nagasawa gives it -- need not be attacked by theists -- because it is self-stultifying. Its first premise entails the existence of God, the very contradictory of what the argument is intended to establish. One might respond that the "Atheological" Knowledge Argument, read rightly, does not aim to establish the non-existence of God, but only that traditional theism is false -- in the face of the acknowledged existence of God (as entailed by its first premise). However, this is not what critics of traditional theism usually have in mind, and it is certainly not what the critics of traditional theism Nagasawa has in mind have in mind (see p. 44). As far as Nagasawa's reconstruction of the argument is concerned, it must be denied that his assertion that "G = D" is uncontroversially true is itself true.

With regard to the Knowledge Argument in the above set-theoretical form, Nagasawa proposes to reject it by rejecting its first premise, while accepting "for the sake of the argument" its second premise (p. 123). According to Nagasawa (ibid.), "very few philosophers" have questioned the argument's first premise. Nagasawa announces that in questioning the first premise he will also offer a "new objection" to the argument. But the only thing to be said about the first premise of the Knowledge Argument in the above form is that every philosopher knows that premise to be false. There never was, is, or will be a human being who is physically omniscient, that is, a human being with regard to whom "M = P" (referring "M" to any human being) is true. And therefore a physically omniscient Mary -- in a deterministic physical world, she would be the equivalent of Laplace's Demon, and in a non-deterministic physical world, she would even surpass that demon -- does not exist, nor has she ever existed, nor will she ever exist.

There is no need to deny that Mary is physically omniscient: every philosopher knows that she is not. What, then, is the true form of the Knowledge Argument since, evidently, it is not the one presented above? The nature of the Knowledge Argument, which Nagasawa appears to have missed entirely (in any case, he does not make it explicit), is this: it is a counterfactual argument, referring essentially to what is true in a certain counterfactual situation and to what is supposed to be necessitated by that which is true in that situation. Thus, the gist of the Knowledge Argument is this:

If Mary [take any Mary you know] were physically omniscient [contra factum!] but subject to conditions that allowed her to have experiences only in a rather limited way, she would not be omniscient simpliciter.

But if physicalism is true, then Mary would be omniscient simpliciter if she were physically omniscient, even though she were at the same time subject to conditions that allowed her to have experiences only in a rather limited way.

Therefore: Physicalism is false.

Jackson's description of the situation Mary finds herself in -- the Mary-scenario -- is intended to establish the truth of the first premise of this argument. The central issue in this regard must be whether Mary's lack of certain experiences leads indeed (inexorably) to her lack of knowledge with regard to certain aspects of phenomenal consciousness (cf. above the italicized presupposition of the Knowledge Argument). Physicalists will of course deny the necessity of the no-experience-no-knowledge nexus; dualists will of course assert it. It is doubtful whether an impartial rational judging of the matter is possible.

In contrast, the second premise of the Knowledge Argument in counterfactual form is evidently true. Finally, the logical form of the Knowledge Argument in counterfactual form amounts, fully spelled out, to this:

If A and B were the case, then C would not be the case.

Φ ⊃ (if A and B were the case, then C would be the case).

It is possible that A and B.

Therefore: non-Φ.

Here "⊃" can be taken to stand simply for material implication. Thus, the Knowledge Argument in counterfactual form is logically correct: the conclusion does follow logically from its premises -- one of which, the third one, is indeed a tacitly understood premise, but nevertheless a true premise if "possible" is understood in the appropriate, weak sense: It is possible (i.e., true in some possible world) that Mary is physically omniscient and at the same time subject to conditions that allow her to have experiences only in a rather limited way. (Note that this last sentence is the third -- the tacit -- premise of the Knowledge Argument in counterfactual form.)

Now, does Nagasawa address the question of the truth of the crucial first premise of the above argument -- of the first premise of the Knowledge Argument in counterfactual form, not of the straw-man argument he substitutes for it? Does he question the truth of "If Mary were physically omniscient but subject to conditions that allowed her to have experiences only in a rather limited way, she would not be omniscient simpliciter"? He does not. Instead, his criticism of the Mary Argument -- which is the Knowledge Argument -- comes down to something which has nothing to do with that premise: "Jackson's assumption (32) -- that is, in principle, one can be physically omniscient by simply reading black-and-white books and watching black-and-white television -- is false and the Mary argument fails" (p. 128). For Nagasawa, the falsity of Jackson's assumption is supposed to refute or to cast doubt on the thesis that Mary is physically omniscient -- the thesis which is the first premise in Nagasawa's straw-man reconstruction of the Mary Argument (see above). That the falsity of Jackson's assumption has such consequences is rather questionable in itself. But, as I noted before, no philosopher believes that Mary is physically omniscient anyway. Curiously, Nagasawa believes that "a number of philosophers take it for granted that Mary is physically omniscient" (p. 131); he gives references for Chalmers, Loar, Lycan, Pettit, Sommers, and Vierkant. What Nagasawa should have said is this: these philosophers take it for granted that it is possible (i.e., true in some possible world) that Mary is physically omniscient.

If one reads Nagasawa benevolently (which, note, I am not unwilling to do), then one can take him to be rejecting the third premise of the Knowledge Argument in counterfactual form, which premise states a matter of possibility, not of actual fact. For this, one must assume that Nagasawa, when referring to the question of Mary's physical omniscience (in conjunction with her rather limited access to experiences), means to refer to a question of possibility, and not to a question of actual fact (which he, however, more often than not appears to mean to refer to, especially judging by the way in which he formulates the Knowledge Argument). The rejection of the third (the tacit) premise would block the Knowledge Argument in counterfactual form, since that premise is indeed needed: without it, the two other premises might be made true in a trivial manner, no matter what the truth-value of physicalism (Φ). But has Nagasawa adequately shown that that third premise is false or doubtful? Has he shown it to be false or doubtful that it is possible (i.e., true in some possible world) that Mary is physically omniscient and at the same time subject to conditions that allow her to have experiences only in a rather limited way? I don't believe he has.

In the alleged failure of the Mary Argument, Nagasawa sees motivation for assuming the following thesis (p. 132):

(i) Physical omniscience is omniscience simpliciter.

This he combines with the following thesis that he also believes to be made plausible by considerations surrounding the Mary Argument (ibid.):

(ii) Theoretically communicable physical omniscience is not omniscience simpliciter.

And he tells us (p. 136):

(iii) Omniscience simpliciter requires an instantiation of extraordinary epistemic powers to intuit relevant propositions.

Well, who would have expected that? What news is it to be told that (iii) is true? The conjunction of the epistemic theses (i), (ii), and (iii) added to the ontological claim of physicalism that everything in this world is physical is called "nontheoretical physicalism" by Nagasawa (p. 13). I have already noted that (iii) goes without saying; (i), in turn, is a consequence of the ontological claim of physicalism, and in this sense also goes without saying. This leaves us with (ii). But (ii) is no news either. Not every true physical proposition can be expressed in a language of theoretical communication (i.e., by some finite statement); hence (ii) can only be true.

Thus, the ontological claim of physicalism -- not the superstructure of Nagasawa's "nontheoretical physicalism" -- turns out to be what is mainly interesting. According to Nagasawa, "the fact that the two of the strongest existing arguments against physicalism fail [i.e., Jackson's Mary and Nagel's Bat] increases further the plausibility of physicalism, which has already been very high" (p. 137). But Nagasawa has not established that the failure of those arguments is a "fact"; moreover, I beg to differ regarding the "very high plausibility" of physicalism. (For more on these matters, see my 2004 book, The Two Sides of Being: A Reassessment of Psycho-Physical Dualism.)

Nagasawa is in sympathy with philosophical attempts to combine "theism in the Abrahamic tradition" with "physicalism in general" (p. 143). This makes me wonder which part of the physical world God -- the Abrahamic god (in the Judaic, Christian, or Islamic tradition) -- might plausibly be now. If, however, He is considered to exist now without being a part of the physical world and "physicalism in general" is nevertheless supposed to be true by Abrahamic theistic physicalists, then is not this position somewhat embarrassing for them?

I finally come to a minor point of criticism, which I nevertheless would like to voice here, because it seems to me to be symptomatic for an ever-increasing logical sloppiness in philosophical publications. The three reviewers for Cambridge University Press who read the manuscript (p. xiii) and Nagasawa himself have overlooked that he does not state the definitions of the various kinds of omniscience properly. On p. 7, we read:

Omniscience Simpliciter: For any x, and for any proposition p, x is omniscient if and only if:[2] if it is true that p, then x knows that p.

The correct formulation is this:

Omniscience Simpliciter: For any x, x is omniscient if and only if, for any proposition p, if it is true that p, then x knows that p.

Perhaps Nagasawa thought that it does not matter where he puts the all-quantifier that binds the variable "p". Well, it does matter. For in Nagasawa's formulation the definition of omniscience simpliciter has the following interesting instantiation:

Tommy is omniscient if and only if: if it is true that 1+1=2, then Tommy knows that 1+1=2.

Nagasawa's egregious mistake is repeated in his definition of physical omniscience (p. 7), in his definition of divine omniscience (p. 11), and in his definition of theoretically communicable physical omniscience (p. 12-13). According to Nagasawa (if we take him by his word), Tommy is divinely omniscient if and only if: if it is true that 1+1=2, then Tommy knows that 1+1=2. I hasten to add that, as far as I can see, these errors of formulation lead to no errors of thought in Nagasawa's interesting book.



[1] Surely the proposition that 1+1=2 is in D.

[2] I have inserted a colon -- which is not in the original -- to make the sentence easier to read.