Mary Midgley

The Myths We Live By

Midgley, Mary, The Myths We Live By, Routledge, 2003, 208pp, $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 0415309069.

Reviewed by Sharyn Clough, Oregon State University

In the introduction to her collection of essays, The Myths We Live By (2003)1 , Midgley promises to analyse the myths that we use, for the most part unconsciously, to filter and organise the myriad details of our daily lives. By making the effects of these myths more explicit, she hopes we can, at the very least, think more carefully about them. In the case of those myths that have proven to have outlived their usefulness, Midgley argues, such explicit analysis might even allow us to restrict their influence. She begins by analysing the troublesome effects of three such myths, viz., the social contract, progress, and “omnicompetent” science. (The dustjacket claims that she “demolishes” these myths, but Midgley makes no such claims in the text, and, in any case, such a project seems well beyond the scope of her book.)

As a well-respected commentator in the field of science studies, Midgley shows, not surprisingly, a particular interest in how myths affect and are in turn affected by science. However, the content of each chapter ranges over a wide variety of other topics, many of which are extremely complex (e.g., Ch. 2 “Our Place in the World” and Ch. 20 “Heaven and Earth: An Awkward History”). The collection is made up of 27 such chapters, originally published elsewhere for a variety of purposes, amounting to a slim 175 pages of text. That most of the essays are thus limited to 5 or 6 pages, suggests that these weighty topics are unlikely to get the careful and thorough examination that Midgley herself describes as lacking in our thinking on these matters. Even though it is clear that she does not set out to provide the sorts of detailed and carefully-articulated arguments required to “demolish” any particular myth, the lack of a sustained and careful focus within and between the chapters of her collection informs my main complaint.

As I was reading The Myths We Live By, I kept returning to the question of audience. The publisher of the book, Routledge (recently subsumed by Taylor and Francis), has, increasingly, become known for producing books that are aimed at a more general audience—authors are asked to keep technical language and footnotes to a minimum, for example. Initially, I wondered whether I was identifying weaknesses in the book as a result of my expectation that the book was written for academics, primarily those interested in science studies. Perhaps this book was intended, instead, for a much more general audience. Certainly there are few footnotes, and these are mostly bibliographic and/or suggestions for further reading. However if accessibility to a wider audience was the goal, the book falls short—too often the content and style of the arguments read as superficial rather than accessible.

For example, in a number of chapters, especially Chs. 4 - 6 (titled ’Thought Has Many Forms’, ’The Aims of Reduction’, and ’Dualistic Dilemmas’, respectively), Midgley discusses the dangers of the myth of reductionism. But nowhere does she acknowledge that many in science studies, both scientists and philosophers of science, have begun to recognise the need for, if not the fact of, holism, pluralism and diversity in the methods and/or subjects of science. Acknowledging the work of her compatriots John Dupré and Nancy Cartwright, in particular, would seem appropriate, but neither receives any mention. While it’s true that a detailed presentation of Cartwright’s work might not be appropriate for a general audience, surely a footnote directing interested readers to further material would not be out of place.

In contrast, her discussions of the myth of reductionism give the work of Skinner an inordinate amount of critical attention. While Skinner’s behaviouristic project was certainly informed by a commitment to reductionism, I am not convinced that his approach continues to carry much weight, certainly not as an exemplar of the on-going influence of reductionist myths in social science. Neuropsychology would seem to be a more appropriate example, but it is not mentioned, nor is the work of the Churchlands or their critics.

These sorts of complaints about the kinds of concepts and projects that (continue to) count as “myths” or “myth-like” could perhaps have been avoided if Midgley had been clearer from the outset about how she was using these terms. However, in the introduction ’How Myths Work’, her characterisations are vague. She is clear that myths are part of science, and should not be equated (necessarily) with “lies” (p. 1). Similarly, she often describes myths in neutral terms as organisational or conceptual schemes. But, at other times, she uses “ideology” and “myth” interchangeably, without a clear indication of when the neutral scheme has become something that is, for many readers, as negatively valenced as an ideology.

One of Midgley’s strengths within science studies is that in her interdisciplinary work she is able to identify and subject to critical analysis the larger patterns that those caught up in the details of a particular scientific study are unable to notice. Often specialists are too close to their topic; they cannot distance themselves enough to provide the sort of critical scrutiny allowed by the more general and interdisciplinary examination proffered by scholars such as Midgley. However interdisciplinary treatment has its own set of dangers, such as making overgeneralisations, and sacrificing any sort of critical depth for the sake of breadth and scope. While Midgley has often managed to avoid this problem in the past, witness the critical success of Evolution as a Religion2 , in this particular collection she does not. She tempts the reader with fleeting historical references to interesting ideas and quickly moves on. And, as I’ve argued, attention to contemporary debates about the myths she mentions is often missing entirely.

To be sure there were a number of passages where Midgley’s critical and incisive capacities as a social commentator come to the fore. In a discussion of the problems with explanatory reductionism (ch. 8), she notes that our mechanistic explanations of human behaviour continue to be informed by the seventeenth-century model of the ghost in the machine. However, while we have jettisoned the idea of a ghost, we have kept the idea of the machine that housed it. The resulting problem, she notes, is that “the Machine that was tailored to fit the Ghost cannot work on its own. We need a new model that does justice to the many different kinds of question that we ask and the ways in which they all converge” (p. 50). A similarly insightful passage follows chapters critical of the mechanistic and reductionistic focus of scientists such as Richard Dawkins and Edward Wilson. In ’Getting Rid of the Ego’ (ch. 11) Midgley acknowledges that Dawkins and Wilson have “done really useful work” in correcting the systematic exaggeration of “both the power and the importance of Homo sapiens relative to the rest of creation” (p. 69). However, in what I’ve argued is characteristic of this book, these insights receive only brief attention. Reading both passages the undergraduate instructor in me made notes in the margins of the form, ’This is interesting—tell me more’.

Of course, we can be fairly confident that even if this book leaves its readers waiting for more detailed treatment of the myths we live by, with an author as creative and prolific as Midgley we are unlikely to be waiting long.


1. Unless otherwise noted all page and chapter references are to Midgley, 2003, Thy Myths We Live By, London: Routledge.

2. Midgley, Mary. 2002. Evolution as a Religion. London: Routledge.