2008.08.08

Johann Georg Hamann

Writings on Philosophy and Language

Johann Georg Hamann, Writings on Philosophy and Language, Kenneth Haynes (ed., tr.), Cambridge University Press, 2007, 252pp., $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521520676.

Reviewed by Ted Kinnaman, George Mason University


Although little known among English-speaking philosophers, the 18th-century German Johann Georg Hamann can be credited with originating a number of the most important ideas in the Continental tradition of philosophy of the last two centuries. His early criticism of Kant (for example, in the "Metacritique on the Purism of Reason") introduces the idea that reason is indistinguishable from the particular language in which one reasons, and thus shot through with the same thoroughgoing contingency. His use of pseudonyms and an opaque writing style to unsettle the relation of the author to his texts, and thus to the rational commitments of authorship, foreshadows the use of irony among the early German Romantics, as well as Søren Kierkegaard's own pseudonymous writing. And his charge that pure reason can never truly be pure, and thus universal and necessary, anticipates a long line of antirationalist argument.

We are therefore indebted to Kenneth Haynes and Cambridge University Press for bringing out, as part of their series Texts in the History of Philosophy, the present collection of Hamann's philosophical writings. Here the reader can find readable English translations of the "Metacritique," "Aesthetica in nuce" ("Aesthetics in a nutshell"), and "The Last Will and Testament of the Knight of the Rose-Cross," Hamann's principal, though not sole, response to the debate over the origin of language. One valuable item missing here that might have been of interest to philosophers is his letter to Christian Jacob Kraus of Dec. 18, 1784, in which he comments incisively on Kant's famous essay "What is Enlightenment?" Kant had defined enlightenment as "the emergence of humankind from its self-imposed minority." Hamann juxtaposes the incapacity [Unmündigkeit] of the many with the domination [Vormundschaft] of intellectuals such as Kant, and suggests that Aufklärer, far from being bearers of enlightenment, in fact constitute a class that benefits from the incapacity of the majority of their fellow-citizens. This ad hominem attack anticipates the much more recent tendency to treat abstract intellectual questions as reflections of the person doing the reasoning.

Another more serious absence here is one of his most interesting and important pieces of all, the early "Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten," or "Socratic Memorabilia." Somewhat oddly, though, the collection does include the two dedications of that work, which admittedly are quite interesting in their own right. "Socratic Memorabilia" is an essential text for understanding Hamann's relation to reason, and to Kant. The second of the two dedications is to "the Two," meaning Kant and his publisher Berens; the former is to "the public, or nobody, the well-known," but it too ends with a swipe at Kant and Berens. It was on a business trip to London on Berens' behalf that Hamann underwent the "conversion" that preceded his religious critique of the Auklärung, and Kant was his early philosophical mentor. "The Two" thus were personal emblems of Enlightenment for Hamann, and by addressing the "Socratic Memorabilia" to them he was also taking his distance from the dominant intellectual movement of the day.

Hamann's key move in the "Socratic Memorabilia" is to use the revered figure of Socrates to explain his rejection of Enlightenment rationalism without thereby himself making a move in the game of reason. Socrates' profession of ignorance, Hamann suggests, is like someone refusing to join in a game of cards, not because he doesn't know the rules of the game, but rather because he doesn't want to play with "people like you, who break the rules of the game and ruin the pleasure of it." Then as now, of course, Socrates was revered by philosophers. But whereas Socrates' ignorance is a token of his self-awareness [Selbsterkenntnis], his Enlightenment followers, by setting aside this wisdom, are "descendants of his accusers and poison-mixers." The whole work is an extraordinarily rich text, in which Hamann not only offers an interesting reading of the familiar puzzle of Socratic ignorance, but also originates the intellectual basis of the concept of the genius (he claims that Socrates in his ignorance had a genius just as Homer and Shakespeare did) and begins the modern tradition of criticizing reason through pseudonymous authorship. Kierkegaard later hailed him for this in his Philosophical Fragments.

Other than the omission of the "Socratic Memorabilia, however, this new volume is an excellent tool for scholars who want to study Hamann in English. Like any really useful edition of Hamann in any language, this one is extensively and informatively annotated. This is essential because in addition to his fondness for puns and wordplay Hamann makes frequent allusions to ancient and modern literature in several languages other than German. Reklam's edition of the "Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten" and the "Aesthetica in nuce," for example, went so far as to alternate pages of text and notes. Here too the notes sometimes occupy as much space as the text, with the result that the annotation amounts to a running commentary on the text. One aspect on which Kenneth Haynes' notes are particularly enlightening is Hamann's many references to the Bible. The notes for "Aesthetica in nuce" bring out a wealth of biblical references in the text that significantly enrich the meaning of Hamann's development of the idea of "nature as text," in which the Bible of course is the most important such text. To give just one example, Haynes tells us that Hamann's mention, near the end of the piece, of God's speaking to us through his Son, is a reference to Hebrews, the language of which seems to anticipate Hamann's view. The overall effect of this is to ensure that Hamann's ultimate goal in writing -- to engage with Enlightenment philosophy so as to preserve the authority of the Bible -- comes through to the reader on every page.

The writing of Hamann's most interesting for contemporary philosophers is probably his "Metacritique on the Purism of Reason," which is his critique of Kant's Critique of Pure Reason. This small, dense text was written in 1784, but published only in 1800, after Hamann's death. It is probably the most difficult of Hamann's writings to translate, because here his many allusions to the Bible and to classical and modern literature are combined with numerous references to the peculiar idiom of the critical philosophy, as well as to the works of Berkeley and Hume. Haynes has produced a remarkably readable translation of the "Metacritique" -- in comparison, that is, with the German original, which is itself hardly readable. Contrary to what might strike a reader on first acquaintance with the "Metacritique," Hamann does actually make a sort of argument in this text, albeit one that needs to be pieced together through interpretation of his many allusions to other texts. The piece begins with Hume's approving reference to Berkeley's rejection of abstract ideas -- "one of the greatest and most valuable discoveries that has been made of late in the republic of letters." This is significant biographically because it connects his critique of Kant in the 1780's with his reading of, among other authors, the great British empiricists in the 1750's. It is also significant philosophically as an indication of the standard to which Hamann intends to hold Kant's system, namely the standard of empirical particularity. Given Kant's own emphatic claim that concepts can have empirical reality only in relation to sensible intuition, Hamann's move can be defended as holding Kant to a standard he himself endorses. The heart of Hamann's argument against Kant is that the language used to enact Kant's critique cannot itself meet this standard. Kant's reason therefore cannot be as "pure" as he imagines, but instead is dependent on "custom, belief, and habit." Hamann's metacritique thus has a strongly Humean cast.

Also well represented and translated here are Hamann's various writings on the topic of the origin of language. This was a hotly debated subject in the 18th century, centering on the question of whether language was an invention of humans in their natural state or a gift from God. Given the importance of language as a mark of the perceived divide between humans and animals, the importance of this debate clearly derived from the question of whether human thought, particularly rational thought, can be understood naturalistically, with the methods of the ever more important natural sciences, or whether instead reason stands apart from nature. In "The Last Will and Testament of the Knight of the Rose-Cross," Hamann characteristically rejects the terms of the debate: The natural is not to be opposed to the divine, nor to the human, and language is a tissue connecting them all. Referring to the scene in Genesis where God bids Adam to name the animals, Hamann writes that in the beginning

every phenomenon of nature was a word, -- the sign, symbol, and pledge of a new, secret, inexpressible but all the more fervent union, fellowship and communion of divine energies and ideas. All that man heard at the beginning, saw with his eyes, looked upon, and his hands handled, was a living word, for God was the word. With this word in his mouth and in his heart the origin of language was as natural, as close and easy, as a child's game.

This last passage is a particularly good example of Haynes' skill at rendering Hamann's opaque German into excellent English. In addition to the "Last Will and Testament," this collection also includes "Philological Ideas and Doubts," Hamann's commentary on Johann Gottfried Herder's prize-winning essay on the origin question. While limited by its focus on Herder, "Philological Ideas" is one of the clearest things Hamann wrote on language.

Other than the important omissions mentioned above, the present collection offers an excellent overview of Hamann's central and most influential philosophical views, with excellent scholarly apparatus and in very clear prose. It is the best English-language source by far of Hamann's work.