2004.10.02

Christopher Peacocke

The Realm of Reason

Peacocke, Christopher, The Realm of Reason, Oxford University Press, 2004, 296pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199270724

Reviewed by Ram Neta , University of North Carolina, Chapel Hill


This is a very ambitious book. Its aim is to provide an elaboration and defense of a novel version of rationalism. But what is rationalism, and what is novel about Peacocke’s version of it? I’ll try to answer these questions in order, and then go on to outline Peacocke’s arguments for his view. At the end, I’ll raise what seems to me to be the most important question that Peacocke has yet to answer.

I. What is Rationalism?

Epistemology aims to discover the norms that govern theoretical, rather than practical, cognition – our thinking about the way the world is, rather than our thinking about what to do. Perhaps the norms that epistemologists seek to discover are norms that apply to epistemic states such as belief or degree of confidence. Perhaps they apply to epistemic actions such as judgment or endorsement. Perhaps they apply to both. However that may be, epistemological norms apply to propositionally contentful states and/or actions.

But epistemological norms also apply to those psychological processes that result in such propositionally contentful, epistemically assessable states and/or actions – psychological processes that Peacocke calls “transitions”. So there are norms governing transitions, and there are norms governing the propositionally contentful states and/or actions that are the results of those transitions. Epistemologists may argue about whether the norms governing the states or actions that result from transitions are to be explained by appeal to the norms governing transitions, or vice-versa. For present purposes, we may prescind from this dispute. All we need to grant here is that transitions and their results are both norm-governed.

The epistemological norms that govern transitions might include the following: if it perceptually appears to you as if p, and you have no reason to doubt that p, and no reason to suspect that perceptual appearances are misleading on this occasion, then make a transition to judging that p. And: if you have very good reason for believing that p, and you have very good reason for believing that p implies q, and you have no reason for believing that not-q, then make a transition to believing that q. These are just two examples of the kind of norms that govern transitions, and that epistemologists are interested in discovering. Whenever the totality of epistemological norms favor your making a transition to q, I’ll say that you are “entitled to make a transition to q” or, for short, that you are “entitled to q”.

In this book, Peacocke attempts to provide a philosophical foundation for the enterprise of discovering the correct epistemological norms. He assumes that the enterprise is viable – that is, he assumes that there are discoverable norms that determine, for any given propositional content p, the conditions under which someone is entitled to p. He seems also to assume that some such principles have already been discovered, at least to some approximation. The aim of his book is not primarily to discover more such principles, but rather to explain the truth of the principles that have already (at least to some approximation) been discovered, and to propose a plan for explaining the truth of whatever further principles will eventually be discovered. Peacocke is not primarily interested in stating the correct function from propositional contents to conditions of entitlement; rather, he’s interested in explaining what makes it the case that a particular function is the correct one. This is the question to which rationalism constitutes one possible answer.

Some philosophers would answer this question by appeal to one or another set of empirical facts – facts about our conventions, or our social relations more generally, or our cognitive ethology, or our neurobiology. The rationalist opposes all such answers. According to rationalism, it is true . priori that a particular function from propositional contents to conditions of entitlement is the correct function, and so no totality of empirical facts can explain the obtaining of this . priori truth. Peacocke endorses this venerable rationalist thesis, and that is what makes him a rationalist.

Ii. How Does Peacocke’S Rationalism Differ From Other Versions of Rationalism?

Peacocke situates his particular version of rationalism as occupying a middle ground between two extreme versions of rationalism. One extreme is what Peacocke calls “faculty rationalism”, according to which we acquire . priori knowledge of the relevant range of truths by means of some special faculty that brings us into some kind of contact with those truths. For instance, the faculty rationalist might say, our . priori knowledge that modus ponens preserves truth is acquired by the exercise of a faculty of logical insight, which brings us into contact with the fact that modus ponens preserves truth. The opposite extreme from faculty rationalism is minimalism, according to which it simply follows from the identity conditions of certain concepts – and follows from those conditions without any auxiliary hypotheses – that particular ways of coming to believe truths involving those concepts count as ways of gaining . priori knowledge of those truths. For instance, the minimalist might say, our . priori knowledge that modus ponens preserves truth is acquired by our forming, in particular ways, the belief that modus ponens preserves truth; and it simply follows from the identity conditions of the concepts of the conditional, of inference, and of truth that, when we form our belief that modus ponens preserves truth in these ways, we count as knowing that modus ponens preserves truth.

Peacocke does not want to incur the faculty rationalist’s commitment to mysterious cognitive faculties. But neither does he wish to agree with the minimalist that certain ways of forming our beliefs can count as knowledge merely by virtue of the identity conditions of the concepts involved in the belief. For Peacocke, the minimalist’s explanation of our . priori knowledge can be the beginning of a correct explanation, but it cannot constitute a complete explanation, for it does not explain (or even seek to explain) why a particular way of forming a belief counts as a way of gaining . priori knowledge. Peacocke wants to supplement the minimalist’s explanation with an explanation of this latter sort.

Peacocke’s rationalism thus avoids the extremes of faculty rationalism and minimalism: it is what Peacocke calls “moderate rationalism”. But how does it differ from the moderate rationalism recently espoused by others such as George Bealer and Laurence BonJour? To answer this question, I will now lay out the main claims of Peacocke’s view. Peacocke espouses and defends three principles. I’ll first state these principles verbatim, and then I’ll explain what they mean.

The Special Truth-Conduciveness Thesis: A fundamental and irreducible part of what makes a transition one to which a thinker is entitled is that the transition tends to lead to true judgments (or, in case the transition relies on premises, tends to do so when its premises are true) in a distinctive way characteristic of rational transitions. (11)

The Rationalist Dependence Thesis: The rational truth-conduciveness of any given transition to which a thinker is entitled is to be philosophically explained in terms of the nature of the intentional contents and states involved in the transition. (52)

The Generalized Rationalist Thesis: All instances of the entitlement relation, both absolute and relative, are fundamentally . priori. (148)

Now, what do these principles mean?

What distinguishes the Special Truth-Conduciveness Thesis from pure reliabilism is all packed into the phrase “in a distinctive way characteristic of rational transitions”. While Peacocke accepts that the reliability of a transition is a necessary condition of someone’s being entitled to that transition, he does not think that it’s a sufficient condition: the transition must not only be reliable, but must be reliable in a distinctive way. What is this distinctive way?

Peacocke’s second principle is an attempt to answer that question. Someone is entitled to a transition just in case that transition is not just de facto reliable, but is reliable because of the very nature of the contents and states that it involves. It is absolutely impossible for that transition – involving those contents and states – to be unreliable. In order to figure out whether a particular reliable transition is one to which a thinker is entitled, we need to figure out the nature of the contents and states involved in the transition. If the reliability of that transition can be seen to follow from the nature of those contents and states, then the transition is one to which the thinker is entitled. Otherwise, no matter how reliable the transition may happen to be, it is not one to which a thinker is entitled. Thus, in order to do epistemology – in order to figure out the correct function from propositional contents to conditions of entitlement – we need to study the nature of the contents and states involved in our thinking.

That’s what the first and second principles of Peacocke’s rationalism tell us. The third principle tells us that, in every case in which a thinker is entitled to a transition, either the thinker’s entitlement is . priori (is provided in part by certain experiences of hers) or, if it is . posteriori, then it is true . priori that the thinker is entitled to make that transition on the basis of her experiences. Even if a thinker’s entitlement to a transition is provided by certain experiences of hers, her entitlement to make that transition from those experiences cannot itself be provided by certain experiences of hers. If we use the expression “F” to refer to the correct function from propositional contents to conditions of entitled transition, then we can state the third principle as follows: it is knowable . priori that F is the correct function from propositional contents to conditions of entitled transition.

So the first two principles tell us that it is necessarily true, by virtue of the natures of our intentional states and their contents, that F is the correct function; the third principle tells us that it is knowable . priori that F is the correct function. That’s what the three principles mean. Together, they form the core of Peacocke’s version of rationalism.

Iii. How Does Peacocke Defend His Version of Rationalism?

Now how does Peacocke argue for his three principles? Peacocke defends the truth-conduciveness requirement set out in the first principle by appeal to the following line of argument: since the aim of theoretical cognition is (at least in the standard case) true belief, what makes a thinker entitled to a transition has to be elucidated at least partly in terms of conduciveness to that aim. Thus, a thinker is entitled to a transition only if the transition is truth-conducive.

Of course, a thinker is not just entitled to any old truth-conducive transition. If the truth-conduciveness of the transition is, in some sense, purely accidental from the thinker’s own point of view, then the thinker is not entitled to that transition. But how should we spell out this qualification? The second principle is Peacocke’s way of doing that: the reliability of a transition is (in the relevant sense) purely accidental from the thinker’s own point of view just in case the nature of the contents and states involved in the transition doesn’t guarantee its reliability. So the thinker is entitled to just those transitions the truth-conduciveness of which is guaranteed by the natures of the states and contents they involve. Of course, this is only one possible way of supplementing the truth-conduciveness requirement to obtain a condition that is both necessary and sufficient for a transition’s being one to which a thinker is entitled. Why does Peacocke endorse this way of supplementing the truth-conduciveness requirement, rather than any other? In short, why does Peacocke endorse the second principle?

The bulk of Peacocke’s argument for the second principle is case-by-case: he considers why we’re entitled to our perceptual judgments, why we’re entitled to our inductive judgments, why we’re entitled to our moral judgments, and in each case offers an explanation in accordance with the second principle. This procedure (which occupies most of the book) provides some inductive support for the second principle – at least it does so to the extent that it is successful in the particular cases.

Finally, Peacocke defends the third principle by appeal to two considerations. The first consideration is this: If the epistemological significance of experience was itself not knowable . priori, then making any particular transition on the basis of that experience could not be rational, and so a thinker could not be entitled to make that transition. Thus, if we are to be entitled to make any transition on the basis of experience, the principle that entitles us to make that transition must be knowable . priori, whether or not we happen to know it. The second consideration in defense of the third principle rests on a general conception of what it is for a proposition or transition to be . priori. According to this conception, a proposition or transition is . priori just in case its truth or truth-conduciveness can be explained from the nature of its content, or of the states that it involves. According to this conception, the third principle is a corollary of the first two principles, and so our defense of those two principles should serve to defend the third principle as well.

Iv. Is Peacocke’S Argument Compelling?

Present constraints of space require me to ignore an enormous amount of fascinating and highly controversial detail in Peacocke’s book. The chapters on perceptual entitlement, induction, and moral rationalism – chapters in which Peacocke presents his case-by-case defense of the Rationalist Dependence Thesis – each deserve considerable discussion, as does Peacocke’s conception of what’s involved in explaining complexity. But I will confine myself here to raising a single general question about Peacocke’s rationalism.

Why is Peacocke a rationalist? As far as I can tell, Peacocke’s rationalism is motivated by the following line of thought: if the epistemological relations between our experiences and the transitions to which they entitle us are not knowable . priori, then it cannot be rational for us to make those transitions in response to our experiences. So they must be knowable . priori. But in that case, these epistemological relations cannot be constituted by the contingent, empirical facts of our social relations, our cognitive ethology, or our neurobiology, for those contingent, empirical facts are not knowable . priori.

Now, why should the rationality of our making a particular transition in response to a particular experience depend upon the . priori knowability of the principle that determines which transition we’re entitled to make in response to that experience? Suppose I have a visual experience as of a red dot moving horizontally across a green expanse. When I have this visual experience, and I don’t have any reason to doubt its veridicality, then I am entitled to make a transition to thinking that there is, before me in space, a red dot moving horizontally across a green expanse. Since I am entitled to make this transition, it is rational for me to make it. Now, when I do epistemology, I come to know all of these facts. But why must we suppose that I come to know them . priori? Why must we suppose that epistemological knowledge, if it’s possible at all, is . priori? Why couldn’t epistemology be an . posteriori discipline? Even if the data to which I appeal are provided by my intuitions, the content of those intuitions might themselves be known only . posteriori, as a result of a great deal of experience that I’ve had?

More generally, one might ask: why couldn’t all theoretical cognition be . posteriori? Peacocke writes “not all warrants can be empirical, on pain of regress” (31). What regress? If I have an empirical warrant for judging that there is a red dot moving horizontally against a green expanse, why must this empirical warrant rest upon some non-empirical warrant? Why can’t all of my warrants derive – either directly (as in the case above) or indirectly (as in the case of highly abstract or theoretical beliefs) – from experience, as Hume suggested? Any contemporary defense of rationalism must answer this question, but I don’t see that Peacocke does answer it.

Perhaps Peacocke’s thinking go as follows: if I do not actually know that this experience (as of a red dot moving horizontally across a green expanse) entitles me to judge that a red dot is moving horizontally across a green expanse, then the experience cannot entitle me to judge this. That is too gross a non sequitur, and not one that Peacocke could possibly make. So perhaps it is this: if I cannot know that this experience entitles me to judge that a red dot is moving horizontally across a green expanse, then the experience cannot entitle me to judge this. But an empiricist can grant this point, and claim that we can know – . posteriori! – that this experience entitles me to judge this. Here’s a way to make this latter possibility concrete:

Let E be the totality of my experiences. And let J be the totality of judgments that I’m entitled to form on the basis of E. Now, why should we think that J cannot include judgments about the entitlement relation between E and J? Why couldn’t E entitle me to form judgments about the world, and also entitle me to form judgments about how E itself entitles me to form judgments about the world, and also entitle me to form judgments about how E itself entitles me to form judgments about how E itself entitles me to form judgments about the world, and so on? Where’s the viciousness in this regress? It’s not that I must have ever more complicated beliefs: what’s at issue is not which beliefs I must have, but which beliefs I’m entitled to have on the basis of E? And if (as it seems to me) this regress is not vicious, then how are we to motivate the requirement of . priori knowability? That is the question that any rationalist must answer. I have yet to see, or appreciate, Peacocke’s answer to it, or any rationalist’s answer to it.