2004.10.12

Paul Janz

God, the Mind's Desire: Reference, Reason and Christian Thinking

Janz, Paul, God, the Mind's Desire: Reference, Reason and Christian Thinking, Cambridge University Press, 232pp, $65.00 (hbk) ISBN 052182246.

Reviewed by Charles Taliaferro , St. Olaf College


This is a difficult book. This is partly due to its range. Janz addressees a host of “post-structuralist” European figures like Derrida as well as Kant, Hilary Putnam, Thomas Nagel, Donald MacKinnon, Bonhoeffer, and others. In juggling such a host of interlocutors, the writing is sometimes cumbersome. Here is a representative passage: “I was suggesting that what Rorty, in comparative literature, or Milbank, in theology (along with many other post-subject compatriots), seem essentially to be appealing to, in constructing what I have been describing as their free-floating ideological historiographies, is a somewhat less consistent form of an art of intellectual traversal which is most purely and ingeniously displayed in Derrida’s goal of ’strategic rhythm’ (or ’undecidability’)” (34-35). For a first book, developed out of a dissertation completed in 2000, there is also an unexpected weariness (or complaints about the boring nature of some disputes) that one would expect from an old, seasoned scholar looking back on decades of work. For example, early on Janz complains of a “now tedious and standardly intransigent stand-off” between two positions, and “the rather unimaginative and stereotypical polarization” between still two other positions which Janz then goes on to talk of in terms of “tiresome predictability and present stagnancy” (all quotes from page 2). Despite some patches of unduly complex and plaintive prose, Janz has undertaken a philosophically interesting project and made some insightful moves on the meaning of Christian language and thought.

Janz sees himself as bound by two forms of integrity. The first concerns intellectual integrity and the second concerns the transcendent. The latter amounts to taking seriously the religious reference to God as an ostensibly transcendent reality. It is because of its failure to respect such a reference to the transcendent that Janz (convincingly) rejects positivism and some fashionable forms of noncognitivism. For Janz, intellectual integrity involves recognizing the normative constraints of thinking over against what he sees as anti-rational and anti-epistemological outlooks (see especially chapters one and two). Janz brings to light the difficulty of adopting a deconstructive theology. In a chapter with the great title of “Theology and the lure of obscurity,” Janz writes: “Derrida’s approach is thus by far the most carefully consistent, sophisticated and intricate of all post-subject outlooks. Yet even he cannot in the end resist inserting a ’feel of meaning’ -that is, the feel of aboutness, or of intentional reference (and as such a feel of purpose, obligation, responsibility) -into his post-structuralist enterprise in order to keep its purity from degenerating into mere bleakness” (40).

At the center of his book, Janz has interesting, critical discussions of Putnam and Nagel. He rejects the work of both on the debate over anti-realism and, in chapter 6, endorses a positive portrait of Kant’s first Critique. Janz holds that Kant shows us we can “speak of engaging in genuinely metaphysical enquiry in a way that preserves and protects both the integrity of the empirical world and the integrity of reason” (p.168). He sees Kant’s stress on “empirical reality” as an important prelude to Christology, and the encounter with transcendence in the incarnation. Given Kant’s reservations about historical, revealed theology this may seem very puzzling indeed. But Janz thinks that what is needed in order to appropriate and be informed by the incarnation is a kind of transformation that Kant did not make (or is not commonly thought of making).

Janz proposes that the perceived problem of theological reference (how do we account for the ability to refer to God?) rests upon our conception of ourselves as autonomous human beings, certainly a Kantian notion. “The question of reference to the transcendent can never be asked by autonomous human being because autonomous human being will by its very nature demand to encounter the transcendent as non-transcendent (even while perhaps giving an appearance of attempting to preserve transcendence), that is, as that which is classifiable within, or referenceable according to, some system of ordering. Or in other words, autonomous human being will always ask about the transcendent on its own terms and accordingly will not be searching for genuine transcendence. This is part of its despair” (214). Janz employs Bonhoeffer in arguing that the meaning of religious transcendence is better (or only?) grasped when the inquirer is oriented to God as a creature as opposed to an autonomous individual. “Thus, an ontological transformation is required in the questioner’s very self in order for genuine theo logical questioning to occur, an ontological reorientation involving a movement from an autonomous way of being human to a creaturely way of being human” (214). The final chapters seek to articulate this new-found reorientation as the Christian theologian encounters the transcendent in Christ.

Although Janz does not treat Kierkegaard at length, this book will be of special interest to those philosophers who work on Kierkegaard. God, the Mind’s Desire will also appeal to those who, like David Ford, seek to re-think Christian orthodoxy after the presumed defeat of modernism. The book is part of the Cambridge Studies in Christian Doctrine under the editorship of Colin Gunton and Daniel Hardy.