John Sellars

The Art of Living: the Stoics on the Nature and Function of Philosophy

Sellars, John, The Art of Living: the Stoics on the Nature and Function of Philosophy, Ashgate, 2003, 238pp, $74.95 (hbk), ISBN 0754636674.

Reviewed by Brad Inwood, University of Toronto


In a book based on his doctoral dissertation (University of Warwick, 2001), John Sellars presents an extended argument about the nature of philosophy as understood in much of the ancient tradition. Building on the foundation laid by Socrates, the Stoics worked out in detail a conception of philosophy as a craftlike pattern of practical activity that structures a human life. For the Stoics, Sellars argues, intellectual theorizing had to be combined with the practical activity of living in a certain manner, an activity made possible by a kind of training or askêsis that complements the logos which, in his view, other ancient philosophers overemphasized. This Socratic strand in Stoicism was systematically attacked by Sextus Empiricus, among others, and nevertheless culminated in two works which are presented as the paradigms of the Stoic contribution to philosophy in the proper sense, the Handbook of Epictetus and the Meditations of Marcus Aurelius. If Sellars’ portrayal of the Socratic-Stoic tradition were exactly right, we would do well to reconsider our assessment of the centrality of analysis and argument to the ancient conception of philosophy. I don’t, however, think we need to do so quite yet.

Part I begins with a short chapter copiously demonstrating that there was a powerful tradition of looking to deeds (erga) and not just to words (or arguments, logoi) in the portrayal of what philosophy and a philosopher should be. The central symbol is the beard of the philosopher, and Sellars reviews the evidence, mostly of Imperial date, establishing that the sporting of facial hair became a necessary (though not sufficient) sign of genuine philosophical commitment. Sellars suggests plausibly that the emergence of this symbol was determined by the cultural collision between typically clean-shaven Roman elite and typically bearded Greek intellectuals; however, he strays too far into psychobiography when he claims (17) that Cicero’s beardless state should convince us that he wasn’t really serious about the pursuit of philosophy. That may of course be true, but we look in vain for evidence that the beard had taken on such a powerful cultural valence by the first century B.C. The rest of chapter one presents a strong case for the importance of biographical narrative to the ancient understanding of what it meant to be a philosopher, emphasizing throughout the centrality of practical follow-through over mere abstract argument.

There is, however, a slippery transition from the perfectly credible claim that a great many ancient thinkers regarded erga and not just logoi as being essential to philosophy to the stronger and essentially undefended assertion that philosophy was thought of as something primarily expressed in actions (32). It is not difficult to embrace the denial that the ancients routinely treated philosophy as merely theoretical; but the further claim that theory and argument were secondary needs more support than Sellars ever provides.

In chapter two the Socratic foundations of the idea that philosophy is a craft or art (technê) for the management of life are explored in depth. The Apology is treated as the central text for establishing the significance of Socrates’ life and work. This reasonable starting point turns, however, into a rather exaggerated contrast of Aristotle with Socrates. In this contrast Aristotle plays the role of the villain, not only prompting the erroneous view of Socrates as a primarily dialectical philosopher devoted to the pursuit of definitions rather than to transforming one’s life for the better, but himself espousing an extreme version of theoretical philosophy. The chapter includes a long and valuable discussion of various kinds of technê in Plato and an interesting discussion of the often neglected Alcibiades. But the characters in this intellectual drama turn out to be two-dimensional. The Socratic drive for definition (on prominent display in so many dialogues) is not fully acknowledged by Sellars. Nor does his story permit a proper understanding of the practical Aristotle who holds that the supreme science is politikê (which sets the pattern for the lives of everyone in the polis, even the theoretical philosopher) and who gives us in Nicomachean Ethics 3 a more detailed theory of how moral practice leads to the acquisition of a virtuous disposition than is ever advanced in the Socratic dialogues. Similarly there is a puzzling silence about the vast tracts of Plato’s Republic which deal explicitly with the way of life of philosophers and the practices which conduce to that way of life. On Sellars’ story, philosophy as a way of living one’s life is an ideal that leaps directly from Socrates to the Cynics and Stoics without touching down significantly in the works of the non-Socratic Plato or in Aristotle.

Chapter 3 is the heart of the book. Here we get a detailed discussion of the Stoic conception of the ars vitae and all the direct evidence for that conception. Most of this is very good, though it could have been strengthened considerably by careful use of some of the central literature on the problem. I note in particular the absence of Roswitha Alpers-Gölz Der Begriff Skopos in der Stoa und seine Vorgeschichte (1976) and I.G. Kidd’s ’Moral Actions and Rules in Stoic Ethics’ in The Stoics ed. J. Rist (1978). The former includes the most comprehensive collection of material known to me on the structure of ancient stochastic crafts as they bear on Stoicism, and the latter remains, after nearly thirty years, the basic work on the question of how reasoning affects action and character in Stoic ethical theory. Both of these are central themes of this chapter, and if it has any limitation it is in not exploring the dynamic relationship in Stoic ethics between serious philosophical reasoning and the practice of character formation. Neglect of this aspect of Aristotle’s work led to a simplistic portrayal of his role in the story Sellars is telling, but it is disappointing to see this limitation reappear in the central chapter and so to pave the way for an equally one-sided portrayal of Stoic philosophy in part II.

After an interesting discussion of the extensive attack on the Stoic conception of a craft of life by Sextus Empiricus (in chapter 4), Sellars moves on in part II to the theme of philosophical exercises. Following closely the lead of Hadot and Foucault (though in many places offering more explicit argument than either of them), he argues that askêsis is the primary vehicle for philosophical and moral growth in Stoicism. The case for this claim rests heavily on the selection of Epictetus’ Handbook and the philosophical diary of Marcus Aurelius as paradigms of such philosophical and spiritual exercises (and to a lesser extent on the undefended adoption of Nussbaum’s sweeping assertion that Seneca’s letters should be regarded as a large-scale example of such exercises). The analysis of the Handbook (ch. 6) provides the most extended support for this set of claims, but even here the argument is marred by two flaws. First, it takes lengthy and not always plausible exposition to show that the Handbook functions as a set of exercises organized around Epictetus’ three philosophical topoi (closely following Hadot again). The basic framework of the discussion depends heavily on Simplicius’ commentary and while there is no doubt that the sixth-century Neoplatonist recommended using the Handbook as a template for philosophical exercises, it does not follow that its author intended it for the same purpose. Second, no serious account is taken of the fact that the Handbook is the work of Arrian rather than Epictetus himself. Indeed, even the Discourses from which the Handbook is derived is some sort of construction out of Epictetus’ oral teaching by the same disciple, a literateur whose manifest aim was to present himself as the new Xenophon in an age of archaising Atticism. Even if the Handbook were most plausibly read as a textbook for spiritual exercising, that would be the doing of a Stoic camp-follower with idiosyncratic motivations rather than the work of a philosophically focused Stoic teacher. Arrian, like the emperor Marcus (whose Stoic credentials are subject to serious question) and so many of their contemporaries, was committed to a broad conception of a generically philosophical way of life that owed as much to the Platonism of the day as it did to the Stoicism of the Hellenistic period.

In part II, then, Sellars constructs a picture of Stoicism as focused essentially on askêsis and philosophical/spiritual exercises. Here and in chapter 3, on the early Stoic notion of an ’art of life’, he devotes very little attention to the interaction between structured argument and the formation of character, preferring instead to present logos and askêsis as distinct and competing (or sometimes complementary) forces in a battle over the proper conception of philosophy. This is an unnecessarily limited approach, one that sidesteps a potentially rewarding investigation into the internal dynamics of moral growth in various ancient ethical theories. Sellars’ neglect of Aristotle’s theory of character formation and analysis of the intimate relationship between virtues of character and of intellect is paralleled by his lack of interest in the detailed workings of the Stoic analysis of the same issues in their theory. Instead of an exploration of how a moral craft might really work (as a fusion of hard intellectual analysis and character formation) we get a false polarity between logos and askêsis that seems to depend more closely on the lingering tensions between continental and analytical traditions in contemporary philosophy than it does on the evidence from the ancient philosophical tradition which has been so sadly drafted into a foreign war. Despite a great deal of careful analysis and argument and many sensitive readings of often neglected texts, The Art of Living misses its chance to make a serious impact on one of the central issues in ancient moral theory.