2008.10.12

Quentin Meillassoux

After Finitude: An Essay on the Necessity of Contingency

Quentin Meillassoux, After Finitude: An Essay on the Necessity of Contingency, Continuum, 2008, 148pp., $19.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780826496744.

Reviewed by Gabriel Riera, University of Illinois, Chicago


Scientific knowledge often produces statements that refer to realities prior to the appearance of human life, such as the age of the earth and the universe, or the exact dating of a fossil whose species vanished well before human knowledge came into existence. Such statements of astrophysics, geology, and paleontology imply a temporal discrepancy between thinking and being, between the world and the very emergence of thinking. At stake in what Quentin Meillassoux refers to as "ancestrality," the "arche-fossil," and "dia-chronicity" is the nature of empirical science in general, and most importantly, the question of the contentious relationship between philosophy and contemporary scientific discourse. Even though he begins After Finitude with a question pertaining to empirical knowledge, it soon becomes clear that, by taking the meaning of ancestral statements literally, he raises a series of issues that touch the very core of current philosophical debates. This is because the problem of the arche-fossil points to the ontological question of the coming into being of givenness as such, the factiality [factualité] -- the transcendental structure -- of the "there is," and the very possibility of thinking the absolute. Meillassoux argues that the stakes are high since science is able to think a time that cannot be reduced to any givenness, or that preceded givenness itself and, more importantly, whose emergence made givenness possible. One begins to understand the audacity of these claims insofar as they posit a time radically different from that of consciousness, a time that, due to its indifference, would seem to resist the modern tenets of the inseparability of the act of thinking from its content, thus enabling us to conceive the realms of phenomena and of the in-itself each apart from the other. Meillassoux's postulates, therefore, aim to break with those of what he refers to as correlationism: the dominant philosophical position that following Kant postulates that our knowledge can engage only with what is given to thought and never with an entity subsisting by itself, and that reaches its exhaustion with Heidegger and Wittgenstein. This book breaks with modern philosophy in showing that it is science that compels the thinker to discover the source of its own absoluteness. The book therefore deals with two issues -- the arche-fossil and Hume's problem regarding the necessity of the causal connection -- that are linked to the question of the absolute scope of mathematics. The rehabilitation of the mathematical absolute contests three prevalent positions for which the de-absolutization of thought also implies its de-universalization: first, all forms of neo-Kantianism and the different varieties of the contemporary "return to Kant", for whom it is only possible to uncover the universal conditions for an entity's perceptibility; second, the philosophy of "radical finitude" that thinks the facticity of our relation to the world in terms of a situation that is itself finite; and finally, all forms of postmodernism that dismiss any claim to universality as a mystifying relic of old times.

How then can one conceive the absolute today without falling back into a dogmatic, metaphysical position, or ending up in a skeptical one? It is clear that the absolute in question is a deflated one, an a-significant and reasonless absolute devoid of any mystery, unable to elicit an enigma, one which recalls Angelus Silesius's dictum according to which "the rose is without why." In fact, we have to come to grips with how Meillassoux generalizes the unreason of all things in his exhaustive demolition of the principle of sufficient reason, seeking to give way to a rational discourse on unreason. The wager, therefore, consists in discovering a form of "absolute necessity that does not reinstate any form of absolutely necessary entity" (33). What is at issue throughout the book is to separate the absoluteness of metaphysical discourse from the broadly accepted claim that any conception of the absolute must necessarily be metaphysical. It is a question of thinking an absolute without thought, an absolute both independent from thought, and able to be conceived by thought in the eventuality of thought's own absence or disappearance.

Chapter 2, "Fideism, Metaphysics, Speculation," not only maps the different positions that have determined and still determine different conceptions of the absolute, but also exposes the necessary conditions to de-absolutize correlationism and thus clear the way toward a truly speculative materialist form of the absolute. This is the goal of chapter 3, "The Principle of Factiality." When it comes to contemporary forms of thinking the absolute, the speculative materialist thinker finds that contemporary philosophy has given up any pretension to think the absolute, but this does not necessarily imply the disappearance of absolutes (as can be witnessed in the philosophies of radical finitude, and in Levinas's thinking of the wholly Other): "The end of metaphysics, understood as the 'de-absolutization of thought' is thereby seen to consist in the rational legitimation of any variety of religious (or poetic religious) belief in the absolute, so long as the latter invokes no authority besides itself." (45) For Meillassoux, therefore, the end of metaphysics took a fideist turn, a diagnosis that leads him to conclusions not different from those of Alain Badiou and Slavoj Žižek: "by forbidding reason any claim to the absolute, the end of metaphysics has taken the form of an exacerbated return of the religious" (45). Moreover, modernity did not result in the oft-repeated process of secularization, but rather in a religionizing [enreligement] through de-Christianization. Against this current situation, the goal is to find access to an absolute "capable of founding science's (ancestral) discourse." (50)

Facticity is the point of departure for gaining access to this absolute: Meillassoux shows that it is not the correlation, but rather the facticity of the correlation, that constitutes the absolute. This entails changing the function facticity has had for correlationism, insofar as it has to be understood not as limiting our knowledge of the absolute, but instead as granting us knowledge of it. In the end, facticity amounts to unveiling the in-itself. The proof of this follows from Meillassoux's demanding argument designed to exhibit correlationism's blind spot and open a path out of the "correlationist circle." The absolute is the possible transition, the becoming devoid of reason, with the proviso that for the speculative materialist, unlike for the agnostic or skeptic, it is a possibility of knowledge, and not an index of ignorance. Furthermore, facticity is finally transformed into the real property of everything that is capable of "actually becoming otherwise and without reason." (52) This is so because the absolute is "the possible transition, devoid of reason, of my state towards any other state whatsoever" (56). The consequence of facticity consists in asserting the actual contingency of the laws of nature, a seemingly odd consequence if one keeps in mind that one of the book's goals is to provide a foundation for scientific knowledge. The absolutization of facticity -- the idea according to which Meillassoux posits the absolute impossibility of a necessary being -- entails a shifting away from the principle of sufficient reason into an anhypothetical and absolute principle of unreason.

Nevertheless, if facticity allows for a way out of correlationism, the primary absolute that results from its absolutization cannot function as a foundation of scientific knowledge. This is because this absolute appears as an extreme form of chaos ("hyper-chaos"), as a time that is "the eternal and lawless possible becoming of every law." (64) Moving away from this primary chaotic absolute into a secondary and mathematical absolute entails a closer look at the transformation that the notion of facticity underwent once it was finally extricated from the correlationist circle. This transformation allows Meillassoux to introduce a new notation, factiality [factualité] or the principle of factiality, which indicates that facticity is no longer conceived as an intra-worldly thing, but rather as a speculative transcendental principle. Furthermore, two propositions are derived from this principle -- the principle of non-contradiction, and the necessity of the "there is". These propositions, in turn, enable the author to defend Kant's thesis concerning the existence of the thing-in-itself.

By claiming that physical laws are contingent, Meillassoux proposes in chapter 4 a speculative solution to Hume's problem of primary and secondary qualities. The author's treatment of what at first could have passed for an innocuous metaphysical non-problem is implemented in order to transform our outlook on unreason. A truly speculative solution to Hume's problem must conceive a world devoid of any physical necessity that, nevertheless, would still be compatible with the stability of its physical laws. Here contingency is the key concept that, insofar as it is extracted from Humean-Kantian necessitarianism and thus distinguished from chance, enables Meillassoux to explain how and why Cantor's transfinite number could constitute a condition for the stability of chaos. Here we find the transition from the primary absolute to the secondary or mathematically inflected absolute. The demonstration thus consists in implementing the ontological implications of the Zermelo-Cantorian axiomatic as stipulated by Alain Badiou in his Being and Event. This axiomatic enables Meillassoux to show that for those forms of aleatory reasoning to which Hume and Kant were subservient, what is a priori possible can only be conceived as a numerical totality, as a Whole. However, this totalization can no longer be guaranteed a priori, since Cantor's axiomatic rules out the possibility of maintaining that the conceivable can necessarily be totalized. Thus Cantor provides the tool for a mathematical way of distinguishing contingency from chance, and this tool is none other than the transfinite, which Meillassoux translates into an elegant and economical statement: "the (qualifiable) totality of the thinkable is unthinkable." (104) This means that in the absence of any certainty regarding the totalization of the possible, we should limit the scope of aleatory reasoning to objects of experience, rather than extending it to the very laws that rule our universe (as Kant illegitimately did in the Critique of Pure Reason), as if we knew that the these laws necessarily belong to some greater Whole.

In the end, the non-dogmatic affirmation of the existence of primary qualities amounts to positing a mathematical absolute and rehabilitating its validity beyond or on the hither side of fideism, idealism, and metaphysical dogmatism. The book's goal thus consists in "re-absolutizing the scope of mathematics -- thereby remaining … faithful to the Copernican decentering -- but without lapsing back into any sort of metaphysical necessity, which has indeed become absolute. It is a matter of holding fast to the Cartesian thesis -- according to which whatever can be mathematized can be rendered absolute -- without re-activating the principle of reason." (126) This re-absolutization of mathematics seeks to reconcile thought with the absolute, two terms that were severed by what the author calls the "Kantian catastrophe," and which he describes as a kind of epistemological regression (Ptolemy's Revenge" is the title of the book's final chapter) into a philosophical model that was not up to the consequences of the Galilean-Copernican Revolution. For this reason, Meillassoux continues the war against Kant waged by Alain Badiou (Meillassoux's mentor) that began in Being and Event with the mathematization of ontology and the re-ontologization of the consequences of Cantor's legacy, thus giving way to a speculative materialist philosophical discourse. For Meillassoux, "Galileanism" names a situation according to which the mathematizable world becomes autonomous, separated from man. It is in the Galilean-Copernican revolution that Meillassoux locates the moment when diachronic statements reveal thought's contingency. In Meillassoux's exact words, the "Galilean-Copernican decentering wrought by science can be stated as follows: what is mathematizable cannot be reduced to a correlate of thought." (117)

Meillassoux's approach to what seemed to be an innocuous metaphysical issue -- Hume's problem of primary and secondary properties -- allows him to uncover a more originary comprehension of the in-itself, and to subtract it from the framework of Kantian transcendentalism. Equipped with the ontological consequences of the Cantorean axiomatic, the author engages in a philosophical argumentation that, at times, as he himself acknowledges, borders on sophistry; his exposition at times looks like a contemporary adaptation of Platonic dialogics, in which the conceptual persona of the philosopher dismantles the adversary with the same tools the latter has employed in his refutations of the former. The book's meticulous argumentation is not for the logically faint of heart. There are passages of logical exasperation that at times may work against its own objectives, thus reinforcing a reactive skepticism. In spite of the absence of resolution to the absolutization of mathematics, the book succeeds in articulating the problematic and in mapping a new field of inquiry. For this reason, After Finitude will certainly play a central role in ongoing debates on the status of philosophy, on questions pertaining to epistemology and, above all, to ontology. It will not only be an unavoidable point of reference for those working on the question of finitude, but also for those whose work deals with political theology, and the status of the religious turn of philosophy. After Finitude will certainly become an ideal corrosive against too rigid assumptions and will shake entrenched positions.

Although the book is written with clarity and consistency, it presupposes a familiarity not only with dogmatic metaphysics, post-Kantian critical philosophy, phenomenology and post-Heideggerian philosophy, but also and above all with Alain Badiou's materialist ontology, and more specifically, with his ontological re-formulation of post-Cantorean set theory, as well as his conception of the event as what exceeds the grasp of an ontology of being qua being. Contingency, Meillassoux's crucial concept, is inextricably linked to Badiou's conception of the event.