2008.11.10

Stewart Goetz, Charles Taliaferro

Naturalism

Stewart Goetz and Charles Taliaferro, Naturalism, Eerdmans, 2008, 132pp., $16.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780802807687.

Reviewed by Paul Draper, Purdue University


This concise introduction to naturalism is part of Eerdmans' "Interventions" series, the purpose of which is to steer a (theistic) course between the "twin dangers" of "deconstruction" and "scientism." Not surprisingly, then, the only part of the book that is favorable to naturalism is the photograph of a serene natural landscape on its cover. This is not to say that the book is unfair or excessively partisan. The authors, Stewart Goetz and Charles Taliaferro ("GT" for short), have far too much philosophical talent and intellectual integrity to attack straw men. But the goal is to attack, and the weapon is first-rate philosophical argumentation.

In spite of the critical nature of GT's project, they do defend some positive theses. Indeed, GT could have avoided the appearance of "going negative" by calling the book "Teleologism,"[1] for the book contains a sustained defense of the position that there are (true) ultimate teleological explanations, both at the human level and also, at least conceivably, at the divine level. Moreover, the term "naturalism" often functions in the book as a synonym either for the denial of teleologism or for the view that a denial of teleologism can in some way be grounded in science. What GT ultimately want to show is that, contrary to what naturalists contend, the deliverances of science are perfectly compatible with teleologism. So there is nothing "anti-scientific" about GT's position, unless of course one believes that it is anti-scientific (as opposed to just anti-scientistic) to offer old-fashioned philosophical arguments for conclusions about what the world is like.

Another thesis discussed in the book is theism. Indeed, no reader can miss the repeated warnings throughout the book that the only thing that really unites and excites the naturalist base is their atheism -- their confident belief that God, or more specifically the God of classical metaphysical theism, does not exist. The book could not, however, have been called "Theism" or even "Naturalism and Theism." For while GT do argue in the fifth and final chapter of the book that theism should be taken seriously, they make no attempt to show that theism is true or even to show that theism is the most plausible of the many distinct alternatives to a naturalistic world view. Rather, the parts of the book that discuss theism do so primarily for the purpose of defending the coherence of teleologism on the divine plane. Accordingly, GT defend theism against objections to the coherence of divine agency but not against other equally serious objections. The book also includes a defense of substance dualism in chapter three. Once again, this fits nicely with the focus on teleologism because it is hard to see how purposive explanations could be ultimate on the human plane unless humans possess libertarian freedom, and it is hard to see how humans could possess libertarian freedom unless they have substantive immaterial minds.

Although GT take the denials of theism and teleologism to be key unifying themes for naturalists, they do not define "naturalism" in terms of either theism or teleologism. Indeed, they offer no "official" definition of naturalism at all. Instead, they make liberal use of quotations in an effort to let naturalists speak for themselves, and they emphasize the notorious disagreement among naturalists about what, exactly, naturalism is. There is something to be said for such an approach, though it can be frustrating for a reviewer trying to provide a clear summary. The closest that GT come to providing an official definition of "naturalism" occurs when they attribute to all naturalists the position that every existing thing is natural. Some naturalists, however, would be skeptical about this position and for good reason. Granted, metaphysical naturalists typically believe that nature is closed, that natural entities have no non-natural causes. But metaphysical naturalism is typically accompanied by the view, often called "epistemological naturalism," that science (understood broadly) is the only source of (theoretical) knowledge about the world. Thus, it would be odd for metaphysical naturalists to add to their denial of supernaturalism the further claim that nothing exists except for nature. For while the success of science in discovering natural causes of natural entities provides some justification for believing that all causes of natural phenomena are themselves natural, science provides little or no justification for the view that nothing non-natural exists. Such a view amounts to precisely the sort of reckless metaphysical speculation that naturalists should oppose.

Although no precise definition of "naturalism" is attempted, GT do make a key distinction between broad naturalism and strict naturalism. While broad naturalists restrict the category of the natural to entities that can be explained, at least in principle, by the sciences (including psychology), strict naturalists are even more stingy, restricting the category of the natural to those entities disclosed by the ideal (and so complete) natural sciences, or, even more specifically, by the ideal physics. The radical implications of strict naturalism are described in the first chapter of the book. For example, the authors contend that strict naturalists must deny the reality, not only of purposeful explanations, but also of libertarian freedom, persistent selves, and even consciousness. In the second chapter of the book, GT argue that these implications of strict naturalism constitute very strong reasons for rejecting it. They also criticize what they (mistakenly I think) take to be the only serious argument in support of strict naturalism, which is the argument from the causal closure of the physical. Their objections to this very influential argument are both subtle and powerful, and are definitely among the highlights of the book.

Broad naturalism is discussed in chapter four. Broad naturalists, unlike strict naturalists, believe that sciences like psychology are needed in order for science to account for all that is real in nature. Also, they allow for purposeful explanations, but claim that they are not ultimate -- that they can be reduced to causal explanations. The reason that not even broad naturalists can countenance ultimate teleological explanations is that, like all naturalists, they believe that everything in nature can in principle be explained scientifically, which implies that scientific explanations, not purposive explanations, must be ultimate. GT reject broad naturalism primarily because, even though it is compatible with the reality of consciousness and normativity, it cannot provide an adequate account of how such things emerge from the physical or biological world. It is not clear, however, why broad naturalists should have to provide such an account. Consider, for example, normativity. GT critique only one sort of naturalist ethics, namely, evolutionary ethics. This makes sense if the intended target is strict naturalism; for strict naturalists must either deny the existence of normativity or account for it in terms of the natural sciences, and biology is certainly the most promising natural science within which to locate (or eliminate) normativity. But why should a broad naturalist, especially one who rejects a hierarchical view of the sciences, try to "biologicize" ethics? Surely evolutionary biology is not the area of science (broadly understood) best suited to account for normativity.

Another natural response to GT's contention that broad naturalism cannot account for consciousness and normativity is that, as science progresses, adequate scientific explanations of such emergent phenomena may eventually be found; certainly we have no good reason to think otherwise. Thus, the fact that broad naturalism cannot account for these phenomena at the present time is a reason to reject broad naturalism only if some plausible alternative world view to broad naturalism can already explain them. GT claim, however, that metaphysical theism is just such an alternative. Of course, naturalists will object that claiming that "God did it" or that "God caused these phenomena to emerge" is not much of an explanation of normativity and consciousness, partly because the phenomena being explained are simply built into the hypothesis of a morally perfect, personal God. GT counter that this objection involves a double standard. For on the one hand, while theists cannot explain the existence of consciousness and normativity in terms of something that lacks consciousness and normativity, they can explain the existence of the natural world in terms of something that is not natural. Naturalists, on the other hand, can hope to explain the existence of consciousness and normativity in terms of something that is neither conscious nor normative, but they cannot explain the existence of the natural world at all, let alone explain it in terms of something that is not natural. GT conclude, not only that theism is no worse off than naturalism, but that it is actually better off, at least prior to assessing all of the relevant evidence (which GT do not attempt), because theists attribute necessary existence to God while ultimate reality for naturalists is contingent.

Their argument for this conclusion is not, however, completely convincing. To begin with, the alleged advantage that metaphysical theists have because they attribute necessary existence to God is not real, since there is no more reason to believe that a concrete non-natural divine person can exist necessarily than there is to think that nature can exist necessarily. The ontological argument, almost everyone agrees, is a failure, and we cannot just "see" the necessity of the statement "God exists" in the way that we can just see the necessity of statements like "all dogs are dogs" or "2+1=3." Lacking both proof and the support of rational intuition, surely one cannot gain an advantage for a metaphysical theory simply by building necessity into the theory. Furthermore, it is not obvious that the existence of nature cannot be explained naturalistically, though admittedly most naturalists assume that the existence of nature is a brute fact.[2] Finally, if either of the two world views has any advantage prior to assessing the relevant evidence, then surely it is naturalism, for the specificity of the theistic hypothesis drastically lowers its probability prior to inquiry. GT could try to justify overlooking this point by noting that most naturalists seem to be subjectivists about prior probabilities. But then to avoid a double standard, GT should add "specific naturalism" to the forms of naturalism they assess, and they should admit that specific naturalism can "account for" consciousness and normativity as well as theism can because specific naturalism is broad naturalism conjoined with the assertion that consciousness and normativity emerge from the natural world.

One final point about broad naturalism. Since even broad naturalists reject teleologism, libertarianism, and substance dualism, GT are able to challenge all forms of naturalism by defending these three "isms." This defense gives a great deal of weight to what they call the "natural" view of persons, which according to GT -- and this is the whole point -- is nothing like the "naturalist" view of persons. But what about a specifically broad naturalist view of persons? Broad naturalists need not deny that we are persistent "selves" who make choices for purposes. GT, however, hold a very controversial view about the metaphysical richness of common sense. They believe that our commonplace understanding of ourselves includes that we are immaterial selves who make undetermined choices for purposes that are ultimate. (Indeed, they define a "choice" as an undetermined mental action.) Some naturalists will no doubt claim that GT are confusing metaphysical intuitions admittedly shared by many who study (and are perhaps corrupted by) philosophy with the much less theoretical folk intuitions of "Joe Six-pack." In any case, experimentation would be required to determine what our commonplace understanding of human persons really is. In addition, naturalists are notoriously skeptical of appeals to intuition or to folk psychology. Still, it is arguably legitimate for non-naturalists like GT to use whatever methods of inquiry are sanctioned by their world view, as long as their goal is to establish, not the truth of their own world view or the falsity of naturalism, but instead the reasonability of retaining their world view in the face of the naturalist challenge to it.

Although GT's assessment of naturalism is, in my opinion, far from complete, I would highly recommend the book to philosophy students at all levels. It would be an ideal text for a course in metaphysics or philosophy of mind or even philosophy of religion. For not only is it a very short book, which increases the likelihood that students would actually read it, but it is full of arguments that are rigorous, clear, and free of technical jargon. In addition to being accessible, these arguments provide excellent models for students to imitate in their own philosophical writing. I would also strongly recommend the book to professional philosophers, especially to naturalists. For the book is an excellent reminder that, while naturalism is unquestioned by most philosophers, there remains serious and all too often unanswered opposition to it, and the problems it faces are deep and difficult.



[1] I borrow the term "teleologism" from Goetz and Taliaferro, who use it in a debate with Andrew Melnyk that is published on the Secular Web. This debate is section one ("Mind and Will") of God or Blind Nature? Philosophers Debate the Evidence, ed. Paul Draper, <http://www.infidels.org/library/modern/ debates/great-debate.html>. Melnyk, unlike me, is not a skeptic about world views but rather a card-carrying naturalist. He offers a very powerful critique of Goetz and Taliaferro's defense of teleologism. Goetz and Taliaferro's response advances the discussion beyond where they leave it in this book.

[2] For an attempt to explain nature naturalistically, see Quentin Smith, "A Cosmological Argument for a Self-Caused Universe," in God or Blind Nature? Philosophers Debate the Evidence.