Robert Wicks


Robert Wicks, Schopenhauer, Blackwell, 2008, 199pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405134804.

Reviewed by Robert Guay, Binghamton University

Perhaps because its potential readership is scarcely larger than the potential authorship, the genre of introductory books on Schopenhauer is of uniformly high quality. The great pessimist would surely be confounded and joyful at the situation, but books whose titles contain little if anything other than the name "Schopenhauer" are generally excellent. I am pleased to report that Robert Wicks's recent effort is no exception.

My task as a reviewer now mostly complete, there still remains to report on the basis for choosing among these peaks of excellence. Fortunately for my task, there are only a small number of points of philosophical interest in Schopenhauer: as a reader of Kant, as a cranky counterpart to Hegel, as a philosopher of art, for pushing his landlady down the stairs,[1] and so on. Thus, one can choose according to one's primary interest. Even when the majority of the page count is devoted to the metaphysics of the will, the books typically emphasize some interest in particular.[2] So, for example, one should perhaps turn to Hamlyn for the reading of Kant, Janaway for philosophy of psychology, Young for philosophy of art, and so on.[3] For an interest in Schopenhauer's project in ethics, one reads Wicks.

A proper buyer's guide would also mention some differentia, e.g., that Wicks stays more distant from the primary texts than is typical, and, in the balance between reconstructing supporting arguments and offering criticisms, gives a thumb down to the former. Wicks somewhat deflates Schopenhauer's promise of noumenal knowledge and conclusive quiescence of the will. As one might expect, then, materialist, Platonic, and Vedic influences receive comparatively less attention than Buddhist ones; and determinism, salvation, love, and mysticism are comparatively neglected in favor of extended treatments of time, the sublime, and the "logic" of manifestation (49ff). In length the book is intermediate to those of Tanner and Magee.[4]

This is an outstanding book, and without doubt the one to read for anyone who wonders whether Schopenhauer has a viable ethical project. With that said, I also have some criticisms.


The book has three main parts: one on "Schopenhauer's Theoretical Philosophy," one on "Schopenhauer's Practical Philosophy," and one called "Schopenhauer in Perspective." But the appearance this gives, of three discrete and equally important topics, is illusory. The purpose of the theoretical section is to explain how Schopenhauer arrives at the metaphysical position that underlies his ethical views, and one can hardly make sense of the final part, with its focus on value and social relationships, without an understanding of the "prescriptions for minimizing suffering" (168) of Part ii. The so-called Practical Philosophy is pre-eminently important here. To be sure, the Practical Philosophy both incorporates metaphysical elements and leaves room for independently important metaphysical claims: being "metaphysically aware" (91) is part of the ethics, and the scope of the conceptual and the possibility of metaphysical knowledge are up for consideration in Part iii. The importance of every claim, however, seems to be subordinate to the transformation in ethical "attitude" (1) that it makes possible.

After a brief but informative biographical chapter, Wicks has a historical narrative meant to explain how Schopenhauer arrived at the metaphysical views that underlie his ethics. The story begins with Locke, and proceeds roughly as follows: Locke's theory of perception helps to explain "how we can become aware of an objective, public world that … contains only qualities associated with space and solidity" (17), but generates a 'veil of ideas' skepticism. This is further aggravated by Humean skepticism about causality, which Wicks renders as the claim that events "are in themselves loose and separate" (23). All this jeopardizes the legitimacy of scientific thinking until Kant's theory of perception recharacterizes causal connections as expressing "logical projections that reflect our rational nature" (25). This succeeds in vindicating scientific inquiry, but the resulting idealism makes knowledge of reality as it is in itself impossible. Schopenhauer then borrows this basic outlook, but transforms it "to allow for knowledge of the thing-in-itself" (28). This transformation involves distinguishing the "world as representation, which is the very product of the PSR [Principle of Sufficient Reason]" (60), from the world as Will, a "blind, irrational, meaningless, and aimless striving" (59) that is the essential reality underlying the illusory world of experience. And once one understands that Will is the metaphysical core of the world, then one arrives, through empathy and asceticism, at an appropriately detached attitude toward worldly desires.

Wicks supplies the many details that fill in this story, and for two reasons I do not care to dispute them. First, this is an accurate portrayal of how Schopenhauer saw himself in relation to the prior philosophical tradition. Second, interpretive success, although valuable, is not the sole desideratum here. Wicks admirably aims to present Schopenhauer's thought "from the standpoint of philosophical consistency" (ix). This implies, I think, that Schopenhauer's thought is so inconsistent that one could reasonably put forward a variety of competing views, each with a claim to representing Schopenhauer. But rather than arbitrarily choosing a view or formulating the inconsistency, Wicks attempts to reconstruct the strongest possible position. This of course illuminates Schopenhauer's philosophical position, but does so in a way that requires an assessment of its cogency.

So far I have presented hardly any of Wicks's reading of Schopenhauer, but the developmental narrative already provides enough to support three broad objections to Schopenhauer's thought. These are not directly objections to Wicks. On the contrary: presenting the philosophical structure in a way that makes objections plain counts as virtuous. But insofar as Wicks claims cogency for his reconstruction, the objections apply to his account, too.

My first objection is that Wicks's Schopenhauer misappropriates the Kantian legacy. Schopenhauer's Kant takes the phenomenal world as "illusion" (44), science to be "worthless for characterizing … mind-independent reality" (22), and metaphysics to be impossible (4, 67). (Schopenhauer disputes the last belief.) This version of Kant has a "theory of perception" according to which "the human factor always affects our apprehension of anything whatsoever" (ix). With our view of the world thus occluded, theoretical enterprises are mostly hopeless. But this reading of Kant manages to combine the 'rose-colored glasses'[5] reading of Kant with the Berkeleyan confusion of epistemic access with ontology -- both of which Kant took pains to distance himself from. That is, Schopenhauer sees in Kant both a dualism of scheme and content, such that it makes sense to ask what content there would be if the glasses were removed, and also the belief that our mental representations are not about anything other than themselves. We can see this in what Wick’s talk of Kant's theory of "perception" (a misleading term at best) leaves out: for example, judgment, apperception, spontaneity, the quid juris, deduction, and critique. What Schopenhauer leaves out, in other words, is the "transcendental" or "critical" character of Kant's enterprise. Kant sees the possibility of experience as requiring an explanation. Schopenhauer in a sense does, too, but offers an answer in terms of what a subject carries out in having experiences. Kant, by contrast, insists on the prior question of what makes experience possible, and argues that this is conditioned by the requirements of unifying representations in a consciousness. Kant is then left with a series of arguments to make that simply do not register with Schopenhauer: that the conditions for the possibility of experience are constitutive, that the validity of our representations requires a defense, and that the validity of our constitutive representations implies empirical realism. Schopenhauer's equation of representation with illusion and his promise of access to the thing-in-itself are, for Kant, not just wrong but category mistakes.

Of course, it is not Wicks's fault that Schopenhauer misunderstands Kant, nor does it show that Kant's position is right. But one might worry how much value there could be in following a philosophical garden path, and this worry becomes acute in the section titled "Schopenhauer in Perspective." If the Kantian inheritance turns out to be little more than the noumenal/phenomenal distinction taken as a Platonic divided line and some phenomenological addenda to Berkeleyan idealism, then there is not much legacy for Schopenhauer to further bequeath, other than some pattern of superficial similarities with positions that others may or may not happen to hold. So Nietzsche's connection is that his "doctrine of eternal recurrence requires us to engage in [Schopenhauer's] sort of universal empathy" (153), Hegel's shapes of self-consciousness "correspond to Schopenhauer's prescriptions for minimizing suffering" (168), and there is a "coincidence between Wittgenstein's realm of facts … and the 'phenomenal world' of both Kant and Schopenhauer" (176).

My second objection is that the metaphysics at which Schopenhauer arrives does not have any clear ethical implications. In Schopenhauer's view, the aspect of the world in which human individuals have discrete identities, act on reasons, and set more or less valuable ends is an illusion: in its ultimate essence, the world is a single subjective "energy or mode of being" (51) called Will that is "irrational, unreflective, unarticulated, directionless, and meaningless" (57). But it is unclear why one should care that the ultimate ground of a world that makes sense is senseless. It does not seem to affect ongoing practices that not this or that particular practice, but the very ground of having practices, is senseless. Granted, one should avoid delusion in whatever one does, but this norm could only be operative when there is a choice between alternatives. By contrast, if anything that one could do would be an illusion in some ultimate sense, then even a realization of this condition could by itself have little effect on one's practices.

Wicks nevertheless insists that "existential implications issue from Schopenhauer's metaphysics of the Will" (87), and makes a case on the basis of the relationship between the Will and the phenomenal world. On Wicks's account, the phenomenal world is the product of the Principle of Sufficient Reason, which in rendering Will susceptible to our discursive grasp turns it against itself, producing violent individuals set against one another. So we are responsible for the world's suffering because "our projection of the PSR [Principle of Sufficient Reason] is responsible for the arena of violent individuals in the first place" (124). Leaving aside the plausibility of this view and whether it confuses constitutive character of the categories with something like causal productiveness, one might nevertheless still wonder about this view's existential implications. Existential implications would seem to require that the self both has enough integrity to be the appropriate subject of ethical concerns, and at the same time is so completely unreal as not to present any ethical interest. More generally, the phenomenal world must be both a source of urgent ethical concern and devalued as completely unreal. Platonic or Christian otherworldly metaphysics preserve self and value in the more ultimate reality; if Schopenhauer does not, then it seems that he must demand that we take as urgent only concerns that arise in the case of our non-reality.

My third objection is that the recommended ethics is in any case unattractive. From what I can tell, there are three general considerations that motivate the more particular prescriptions: "life's pleasures are of relatively low value" (89), "suffering is important to alleviate" (100), and empathy is "the foundation of moral awareness" (114). The first claim is the least plausible, and were someone to dispute it by taking her pleasures as valuable, Schopenhauer has little normative leverage to confute her. Schopenhauer has a stronger case with the claim that suffering is important to alleviate, but then working to alleviate it rather than empathizing with it would be the better approach; nor is empathy necessary either for recognizing suffering or for wanting to get rid of it. If Schopenhauer's point with empathy is to obliterate the distinction between persons, then, on one hand, empathy is inadequate to the task, and, on the other hand, obliterating the distinction between persons would not prioritize the alleviation of suffering but would allow prerogatives to which individual difference would usually be a barrier. But overall the problem with Schopenhauer's picture is that it seems to limit moral phenomenology to a losing battle between deluded, transient pleasure and inevitable suffering, as if there were no other ways of being concerned with or engaged in the world. Such other possibilities mean little to Schopenhauer, of course, but then his ethics comes down to little more than the prudential advice that if you tranquilize your desires as much as possible, then you'll suffer the least. And whether the hypothetical holds and whether the goal is compelling are left to a metaphysical picture that is insufficient to support them.

According to Wicks, "the potential benefit that Schopenhauer's philosophy can produce is immense … since he prescribes a moral attitude that coheres with the sentiments of anyone, atheist or not, who acknowledges the value of traditional morality" (xi). Although I doubt that there is as much coherence as Wicks believes, I do not doubt that Wicks has made as compelling a case as possible for this view, and this brings up a final point. Here Wicks has identified an interesting difference in perspective: whereas the modern project of a secular morality has typically been cast in terms of rejecting the authority of tradition in favor of some form of self-authorizing autonomy, Schopenhauer, to put things in a Nietzschean way, wants desperately to preserve the entire ascetic legacy of morality while eliminating all the ancillary beliefs that made it consoling and meaningful. Here my sympathies lie with Nietzsche, but Wicks has, among other accomplishments, made a cogent case for the alternative view.

[1] It should be said that Wicks's account of the relevant incident (8-9) is especially disappointing, since it contains no stairs and only bare mention of the landlord. One can find a more lurid account mentioned (although not asserted) in John Atwell, Schopenhauer: The Human Character, Philadelphia: Temple University Press, 1990, p. 3.

[2] The best exception might be Patrick Gardiner, Schopenhauer, Baltimore: Penguin, 1963.

[3] D. W. Hamlyn, Schopenhauer, New York: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1980; Christopher Janaway, Schopenhauer, New York: Oxford University Press, 1994; Julian Young, Schopenhauer, New York: Routledge, 2005.

[4] Michael Tanner, Schopenhauer, New York, Routledge, 1999; Bryan Magee, The Philosophy of Schopenhauer, New York: Oxford University Press, 1983.

[5] Wicks does contribute a wealth of new metaphors to replace the venerable rose-colored glasses: the "waffle iron" (24), the "red-hot cookie cutter" (28), and, closer to the original, "a sheet of colored cellophane" (ix) and a "colored lens" (189).