2009.01.06

Pauliina Remes

Neoplatonism

Pauliina Remes, Neoplatonism, Acumen, 2008, 244pp., $18.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844651252.

Reviewed by Peter Adamson, King's College London


Acumen's new series, Ancient Philosophies, offers student-friendly overviews of various figures and aspects of ancient thought. (Where "ancient thought" is rather broadly construed: forthcoming volumes will deal with Confucianism and Classical Islamic Philosophy.) The volume under review here, on Neoplatonism, is one of four to appear so far, the others being on the Presocratics, Cynicism, and Stoicism. It is by Pauliina Remes, who has recently established herself as an up-and-coming scholar of Neoplatonism with her excellent book Plotinus on Self.[1] Moreover, there is a plausible need for a book like this: the only book really comparable to the present one was originally published in 1972.[2] Remes' book benefits extensively from recent work on Plotinus and other Neoplatonic authors, and offers a readable and accurate introduction to the topic. So it is a welcome resource, especially for anyone who teaches in this area.

The first problem that Remes would have had to consider in writing this book was the scope of her task. Neoplatonism, broadly construed, takes in nearly all philosophy in Greek subsequent to Plotinus, including Byzantine philosophy. It furthermore includes a lot of the medieval tradition: even if one hesitates to call, say, Averroes or Aquinas a Neoplatonist, there isn't much doubt that it is an accurate word to use for al-Farabi, to say nothing of the Pseudo-Dionysius and Eriugena. In the event Remes has opted for a narrow (and hence feasible) treatment of "Neoplatonism," whose scope is restricted not only to the late ancient tradition up to commentators of the Alexandrian school in the 6th c. AD, but to the pagan Platonists of this period. Thus she remarks that John Philoponus was "not, properly speaking, a Neoplatonist," because he was Christian (32).[3] Within "Neoplatonism" thus defined, Remes further skirts around the commentators on Aristotle, no doubt because this same series will soon add a volume on the commentators by Miira Tuominen. In sum, then, Remes gives a somewhat restrictive idea of what "Neoplatonism" is, but she is probably right to do so. It should be added, on the other hand, that the later traditions left out by her definition are dealt with in a summary fashion in a closing chapter on the Neoplatonic legacy.

A second problem in writing a book like this is whether to organize the material thematically or historically. Remes has opted for the former, with chapters on such topics as psychology, epistemology and ethics and politics. (This last chapter, incidentally, is an example of how Remes weaves recent scholarship into her account: her treatment of Neoplatonic political philosophy makes good use of the groundbreaking recent monograph by Dominic O'Meara on the topic.[4]) She presents the problems faced by the Neoplatonists first and foremost as philosophical ones, and is at pains to make Neoplatonism accessible to the modern reader. Already in the introduction, for instance, she compares the "layered" ontology of Neoplatonism to that of modern physics (viii-ix, where she also adds the obvious caveats). One result of this approach is that she does not usually start from what would often have been the overriding concern of the Neoplatonists themselves: making sense of the texts of Plato. She does bring in Plato on a regular basis, but typically to amplify and add detail to a theme she has already tried to motivate on independent philosophical grounds. Though this approach may be slightly misleading in some cases, it makes sense. First of all pedagogically: her intended readers may not know Plato well, especially the dialogues that were most important to the Neoplatonists, like the Timaeus, Parmenides and Philebus. But also because Plotinus is the dominant figure in her account, and Plotinus only rarely starts dealing with a question in explicitly exegetical terms. If Proclus were her usual starting point, Remes might have opted for an exposition beginning with apparent inconsistencies or unclarities in the Platonic corpus.

Within any given thematic section, Remes does usually begin with Plotinus, and then move on to later Platonists -- especially Iamblichus and Proclus, but there are useful and interesting passages on Porphyry, Damascius and others. Thus there is a kind of historical structuring of her narrative within the larger thematic structure. It would probably be fair to say that the upshot is an introduction to Plotinus and to certain departures from Plotinus that we find in later Platonists. Remes gives a useful "who's who" of Neoplatonic authors in her first chapter, including such relatively obscure figures as Amelius and Hypatia (these two appear only rarely in the rest of the book, though the rather striking image on the front of the book is a 19th century painting of Hypatia). But I don't think a rounded picture of the thought of Iamblichus or even Proclus emerges from the book. Rather, these later figures appear chiefly in the guise of critics or modifiers of Plotinus.

On these points of disagreement Remes is even-handed and gives a sense of what motivated both parties to the dispute. For instance, she explains the rationale behind Plotinus' notorious doctrine of the undescended soul, according to which a part of the individual human soul remains united to the universal intellect, even if we are unaware of this. But she also points out that the later Platonists who rejected this theory thereby "humanized" human beings, by reserving a kind of thinking and even existence that is proper to the human instead of the divine (118). Thus there is something to be said in favor of both views. Actually I slightly disagree with her reading of Plotinus on this issue, though it may be merely a matter of emphasis: she says that the undescended soul explains how it is that "people get it right remarkably often" when they seek knowledge (116). I doubt Plotinus is so optimistic. I think it is more that if we had no undescended soul, we would not be able to get it right at all. This is consistent with thinking that the vast majority of humans never achieve intellection (compare debates about the "elitist" interpretation of recollection in Plato's Phaedo). Remes also raises a concern about Plotinus' doctrine that I think is not too difficult to dispel. She rightly says that later Platonists derided the idea that we are all permanently happy insofar as we are united to nous. She then adds that it is hard to believe there could be a kind of happiness with no experiential dimension (in other words, how could I be happy without experiencing this happiness?). But as she says herself later on (189), Plotinus, like most if not all ancient philosophers, conceived of happiness (eudaimonia) in an objective way as a kind of flourishing, not as a subjective awareness of flourishing. Perhaps he simply fails to share the intuition that the happy person must know she is happy. I furthermore doubt that this intuition lay behind later Platonist criticisms. Rather, they balked at the ethical consequences of saying that all humans are already flourishing, whether they know it or not.

These, however, are very small disagreements. If I have any general reservation about the book, it is a direct consequence of what I most admire about it: namely that Remes does such a good job of motivating Neoplatonism as a response to a series of plausible philosophical problems. This must be a virtue in an introductory book. But I did occasionally miss a sense of the foreignness and (for us nowadays) deeply counterintuitive nature of Neoplatonism. Take for instance the issues of reincarnation and theurgy. Plato's remarks about reincarnation in the Phaedo and elsewhere more or less landed Neoplatonists with the doctrine of metempsychosis. And certainly some version of this doctrine is upheld by Plotinus; the question is which version. Remes portrays Plotinus' view as barely committed to personal survival across incarnations (120). Yet he is willing, for instance, to invoke suffering in this life as a punishment for past lives.[5] Remes points out that this was an aspect of later Neoplatonic doctrines of reincarnation (129), and in this case I think Plotinus is arguably closer to the later view than Remes would allow.

Even stranger for the modern reader is the Iamblichean defense of theurgy. Again, Remes rather domesticates theurgy when she describes it as "meditation practices and different kinds of therapy of the soul as well as prayers" (171). Only in what follows does she allude to the use of "material objects" like statues and amulets, which were what so disturbed Porphyry and led him to criticize this religious practice. I would have been tempted, here, to go into some detail about theurgic practice, to convey a sense of just how strange Iamblichus' beliefs seem for the modern reader. That would sharpen, and add some context to, his debate with Porphyry. (It's also an interesting question what exactly bothered Porphyry about theurgy: certainly not a lack of pagan piety on his part.) Remes is content to say that Iamblichus' devotion to theurgy shows his awareness of the limitations of human reason (173). And to be fair, this is a judgment numerous scholars have made about Iamblichus' On Mysteries. But I would rather say that in Iamblichus' On Mysteries we find a conception of rationality which includes such practices as theurgy. For him religion does not transcend philosophy; the two are one and the same, so long as they are practiced properly.

Remes seems, though, a bit reluctant to stress the religious aspects of the tradition. In general one gets little sense from her that Neoplatonism, especially post-Iamblichean Neoplatonism, is a fusion between philosophy and pagan religion. Another example would be Proclus' hierarchical ontology, which is discussed well in her chapter on metaphysics, as a complex elaboration of Plotinus' system. Again, it makes a difference here that Proclus is treated fundamentally within the Plotinian framework -- which is rather different from approaching Proclus primarily as a Platonist theologian.[6] Though Remes is good on him as a critic of Plotinus, his criticisms are understood as relatively minor disagreements that do not disturb their fundamental agreement -- after all, they are both "Neoplatonists." I wonder if this is right. It would be interesting to have an introduction to this material that instead emphasized the radical rethinking of Platonism at the hands of Iamblichus, which is then taken on by Syrianus and Proclus. But this might be an unreasonable expectation for Remes' book, which seeks simply to provide a beginners' introduction to Neoplatonism. Remes' remit was to provide a single historical, and above all philosophical, narrative for this tradition. She has achieved this admirably, and I would certainly recommend that anyone teaching a course on Neoplatonic thought give this book to their students to read. Students who are inspired to read further will, one would hope, discover that late ancient Platonism is more than just Plotinus and his critics.



[1] P. Remes, Plotinus on Self: The Philosophy of the 'We' (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007).

[2] R.T. Wallis, Neoplatonism, 2nd edition (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1995). There are also a couple of readers built around texts in translation: K. Corrigan, Reading Plotinus (West Lafayette, IN: Purdue University Press, 2005) and for the whole tradition J. Gregory (ed.), The Neoplatonists: A Reader (London: Routledge, 1999), and J.M. Dillon and L.P. Gerson (eds.), Neoplatonic Philosophy: Introductory Readings (Indianapolis: Hackett, 2004). Remes' volume would be a good companion to the Dillon and Gerson volume; one could certainly build an undergraduate course (or part thereof) around these two books.

[3] She adds a second reason which seems to me somewhat more dubious: "he broke away from the exegetical tradition rampant in the school." Presumably Remes has in mind not his Aristotelian commentaries, which are quite representative of the school and in part perhaps just reports of Ammonius' lectures, but rather his works on the eternity of the world. However, the polemic Against Proclus is among other things very much a work of exegesis, albeit an exegesis of Plato (especially the Timaeus) and not Aristotle.

[4] See D. O'Meara, Platonopolis: Platonic Political Philosophy in Late Antiquity (Oxford: Clarendon, 2003). I take Remes' remark on 177 about "recent research" to be chiefly an allusion to O'Meara.

[5] See III.2.13: disturbingly, Plotinus says for instance that women who are raped are justly being punished for having been rapists in a past life.

[6] For a recent study which nicely emphasizes the intertwining of Proclus' philosophy with his theological commitments and belief in theurgy, see R. van den Burg, Proclus' Commentary on the Cratylus in Context (Leiden: Brill, 2008).