2009.01.21

Tamsin Shaw

Nietzsche's Political Skepticism

Tamsin Shaw, Nietzsche's Political Skepticism, Princeton University Press, 2007, 159pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691133225.

Reviewed by Brian Leiter, University of Chicago


Nietzsche's Political Skepticism (hereafter NPS) is a serious, learned, and novel contribution to the literature on Nietzsche's relevance to political theory. Against the two dominant strands in the secondary literature -- one attributing to Nietzsche a kind of flat-footed commitment to aristocratic forms of social ordering, the other denying that Nietzsche has any political philosophy at all -- Shaw stakes out a new and surprising position: namely, that Nietzsche was very much concerned with the familiar question of the moral or normative legitimacy of state power, but was skeptical that with the demise of religion, it would be possible to achieve a practically effective normative consensus about such legitimacy that was untainted by the exercise of state power itself. Although, as I will argue below, there are reasons to be quite skeptical that Nietzsche was interested in anything like these questions, Shaw has laid down a clear and invigorating challenge to existing scholarship on Nietzsche's politics, and it is one worth meeting.

Shaw's project is animated by interest in the following issue about political authority in the modern era: namely, how can states in practice have legitimate normative or moral authority when religion is no longer available to secure a consensus on the 'correct' or 'true' normative criteria? The problem is compounded by the fact that states need to be perceived as legitimate, and thus will use their considerable powers to produce a perception of legitimacy. Against the power of the state to produce the appearance of legitimacy, the rational insight of philosophers into the genuine moral foundations of legitimacy is no match. That, I take it, is the structure of the problem that animates Shaw's reading of Nietzsche. But is Nietzsche really worried about these issues?

Shaw certainly claims he is; these passages are representative:

Nietzsche is … concerned … with our inability to arrive at a form of politics that is genuinely grounded in normative authority. (3)

[Nietzsche] does not want to give up either on the possibility of having stable political authority or on his commitment to an independent source of normative authority. So his political skepticism derives from the fact that he holds both to be necessary but cannot see how they can be compatible. (3)

States can … manufacture the very normative beliefs to which they then appeal in their claims to legitimacy. We will refer to this phenomenon as political self-justification … . Nietzsche sees this political self-justification as an inevitable feature of secular politics, for he holds that in the absence of myth or religion we have no other means of generating the required normative agreement. (3-4)

Nietzsche's most distinctive argument for political skepticism … rests on the claim that even if we can assume that there are knowable normative truths, secular societies will still have a tremendous problem in making those truths effective in political life. Even objective normative truth would not be able to provide a basis for genuine political legitimacy because the majority of people would have no means of recognizing it as such. (9)

Nietzsche's political skepticism … derives from the following set of arguments: stable political authority requires normative consensus; this consensus must be manufactured deiologically; and although Nietzsche wants to preserve political authority in some form, he cannot concede to the state this ideological power, for he wants to preserve evaluative freedom. His skepticism, then, can be seen to derive from a perceived conflict between the requirements of political authority and the requirements of normative authority. (78)[1]

We may summarize these claims by saying that, on Shaw's view, Nietzsche is interested in what I shall refer to hereafter as "the Question": how is legitimate political authority possible in a secular era? The Question supposes (1) that he is "concerned" about our apparent "inability to arrive at a form of politics that is genuinely grounded in normative authority," (2) that he cares both about "stable political authority" and (3) about there being "an independent source of normative authority" or "evaluate freedom," (4) that he sees "political self-justification as an inevitable feature of secular politics," and holds that (5) "even if we can assume that there are knowable normative truths, secular societies will" face difficulty "making those truths effective in political life" because (6) "the majority of people would have no means of recognizing it."

Unfortunately, the textual evidence that Nietzsche is interested in the Question and is committed to anything like its suppositions turns out to be remarkably slender. Shaw relies overwhelmingly on very early work by Nietzsche from the 1870s, most importantly, Human, All Too Human (1878), but also, even earlier, the Untimely Meditations and some unpublished notebook material from the early 1870s. Indeed, she relies quite heavily on just one passage from Human, All too Human, section 472 (hereafter HAH 472), which she cites, by my count, nine different times (more than any other passage) in support of attributing the Question and its suppositions to Nietzsche (see p. 4 notes 10 & 11; p. 5 notes 13 & 15; p. 13 note 4; p. 14 note 10; p. 23 note 46; p. 32 note 89; p. 149 note 39). In my judgment, Shaw reads more into HAH 472 than is really there.

HAH 472 occurs in a chapter of the book titled "A Glance at the State," one of the very few places in the corpus where Nietzsche writes at length about politics. HAH 472 itself is almost exclusively descriptive, claiming that non-democratic forms of government will find religion useful and helpful because it "quiets the heart of the individual in times of loss, deprivation, fear, distrust" and thus promotes "internal civil peace" even in difficult circumstances. This means that "the state will know how to win the priests over to itself because it needs their concealed and intimate education of souls." Nietzsche then quips: "Without the assistance of the priests even now no power can become 'legitimate': as Napoleon understood." Nietzsche goes on to speculate that in democratic societies religion will, for various reasons, gradually become a matter of private conscience which, in turn, will result in religious belief becoming more diverse and sectarian and eventually in the state becoming hostile to religion and vice versa. (The details of his speculative explanation do not, I think, matter in this context.) Religious and anti-religious parties will struggle for dominance, but if the latter prevail, there will be a "slackening of their enthusiasm for the state: it will grow ever clearer that, together with that religious adoration to which the state is a sacred mystery, a supraterrestrial institution, the attitude of veneration and piety towards it has also been undermined." This sets us on the path, Nietzsche thinks, towards a kind of anarchy.

All the preceding is presented in a purely descriptive, explanatory spirit. Nietzsche articulates only one normative view in the entire passage, when at the end he expresses the hope that "'the prudence and self-interest of men'" can still "preserve the existence of the state for some time yet" given the uncertainties that might attend its demise. From all this, one might fairly conclude that: (a) Nietzsche thinks religion, at least in non-democratic regimes, helps the state survive; (b) religion gradually ceases to play this role in democratic regimes, for a variety of reasons; and (c) Nietzsche hopes that, for reasons of "prudence and self-interest," the state can nonetheless survive. Regarding the Question and its suppositions, this passage only seems to support supposition (2) above.

In Chapter 1 of NPS, Shaw offers us a quite illuminating discussion of Jacob Burckhardt's views on the state, in which Shaw's Question is more clearly implicated. Burckhardt's views would also surely have been known to Nietzsche, as they were colleagues and friends at Basel. Shaw, however, fails to establish that Nietzsche in fact adopted Burckhardt's problematic. She concludes her discussion of Burckhardt by drawing the connection with Nietzsche:

In his "Glance at the State," in Human, All Too Human, he acknowledges that modern states cannot maintain their power through direct coercion, but rather must permanently strive to establish and preserve acceptance of norms, laws, and obligations. [Shaw here cites HAH 441 and 472]. For Nietzsche, as for Burckhardt, genuine normative authority can only be effective if it is able to counter the ideological hegemony of the state. (23)

The second interpretive claim in this passage receives no citation in support, and it seems to me for a simple reason: while Burckhardt seems to have believed this (Shaw's prior discussion makes that case), there is no indication Nietzsche was thinking about the problem of how "genuine normativity authority" can be effective in the face of the "ideological hegemony of the state."[2] HAH 472, as we have seen, provides no support, and HAH 441, the new passage Shaw cites, does not support it either, though it does lend credence to Shaw's first claim, namely that Nietzsche thinks "modern states cannot maintain their power through direct coercion." Unfortunately, Shaw omits the very clear and ultimate point of the passage, which is to lament the passing of unconditional subordination to the will of another. As Nietzsche says, "when this subordination is no longer possible a host of the most astonishing operations will no longer be capable of achievement and the world will be poorer" (HAH 441). Rather than worrying about the prospects for "genuine normative authority," Nietzsche laments the decline of "unconditional authority" (HAH 441) and the kind of subordination it makes possible! (I take it he thinks this kind of subordination makes certain kinds of cultural excellence possible, hence his dismay -- see, e.g., HAH 339, noting the necessity of a caste society for the development of culture.)

If the textual support for Nietzsche's interest in the Question and its suppositions from his early work is a bit thin and inconclusive, it is, as far as I can see, non-existent in the mature works. Shaw is certainly right that Nietzsche rejects, "in both his early and late works" (27) the view of Rankean nationalists who held "that culture could in fact only survive under the protection of a strong state" (26), but that is plainly not enough to show Nietzsche's interest in Shaw's question, as she herself recognizes. For Shaw goes further: she claims that in critiquing state power Nietzsche "is not simply motivated by his desire to defend culture in the sense of artistic and creative life," but rather by his "normative commitments" (27), in particular, his commitment to "intellectual freedom" (28). As Shaw puts it: "What distinguishes the free from the fettered spirits, for Nietzsche, is the ability of the former to determine reflectively their own beliefs and values" (29) which means in particular the "freedom [of] rational self-determination, through the discovery of factual and normative truths" (29 n. 75).

While there is clear evidence, as Shaw says "in both his early and late works," that Nietzsche is concerned about the danger posed to culture of a militaristic and nationalistic state (it is one of the reasons he despised Bismarck), is there any good evidence that this opposition was grounded in his commitment to "intellectual freedom," and, in particular, intellectual freedom understood in the distinctly Kantian way Shaw frames it? Again, she has a handful of Human, All Too Human passages in which Nietzsche contrasts those who "demand reasons" with the majority who "demand faith," with the positive valence on the former (HAH 225). But she nowhere mentions what is a commonplace in the secondary literature, namely, that Human, All too Human is the high water mark of Nietzsche's so-called 'positivist' phase, marked by an uncritical infatuation with science and enthusiasm for reason. This enthusiasm, however, is soon eclipsed by skepticism about the efficacy of reason (especially of 'practical reason' and the putative rational methods of philosophers), though Nietzsche remains an admirer of the empirical sciences.

Shaw does cite (p. 28 n. 71) a host of passages from a later work, Beyond Good and Evil, as evidence of Nietzsche's commitment to "intellectual freedom," yet the passages in question (see esp. sections 41-44) do not emphasize "intellectual freedom" in the rationalistic sense glossed by Shaw ("rational self-determination" and the rational "discovery of factual and normative truths"), but rather celebrate 'new' philosophers as Versucher (those who attempt or experiment) (BGE 42), who are "free" not in virtue of higher powers of rational cogitation or insight, but in virtue of rejecting the egalitarian and democratic ethos of their contemporaries who "strive … with all their might" for "the universal, green pasture happiness of the herd, with security, safety, contentment, and an easier life for all" (BGE 44). Later on in her book, Shaw says that , "Human dignity still seems to [Nietzsche] to consist in independence or self-determination" (105), and cites and quotes a snippet of Gay Science 335, leaving out entirely the fact that this passage describes those who "create themselves" as "the best students and discoverers of everything lawful and necessary in the world," that is, as "physicists." What kind of "self-determination" is possible in a world of the "lawful and necessary"? That is the puzzle this passage poses, but it is completely elided by Shaw through selective quotation.[3]

In Chapter 2, Shaw reads The Birth of Tragedy (hereafter BT) as Nietzsche's attempt to found a 'secular religion,' and situates Nietzsche's task, interestingly, in the context of contemporaneous debates in German intellectual culture. That is plausible, as is her claim that Nietzsche comes to see this project as futile. What is more problematic is her understanding of what is involved in a 'secular religion.' In Shaw's narrative, a "secular religion" is an attempt "to harness the nonrational, persuasive power of art in the service of philosophical insight" (36) or, as she puts it later, "to wield intellectual authority, where the validity of this authority resides in rational justification, but its general effectiveness, given an inequality in our rational capacities, is seen to require the employment of some nonrational means" (39). This is a somewhat surprising intellectualization of the project of BT, all the more surprising given BT's central polemic against Socratic rationalism. Nowhere does she mention what is the central question a 'secular religion' is supposed to address, namely, how to make life meaningful and bearable in the face of senseless suffering. That is the problem Nietzsche inherited from Schopenhauer -- not the problem of the legitimacy of political authority -- and which recurs in one form or another throughout his corpus. Shaw's silence on this point is especially surprising when she points to Thus Spoke Zarathustra as "testament to Nietzsche's ongoing concern, after The Birth of Tragedy, not just to repudiate religion but to find some substitute for it. In particular, the central idea of eternal recurrence seems to be intended to offer a form of secular redemption" (55). But the issue addressed by the doctrine of eternal recurrence is precisely "secular redemption" from meaningless suffering (not the "rational justification" of "intellectual authority"), as Nietzsche makes clear when he returns to Zarathustra at the conclusion of the Third Essay of On the Genealogy of Morality.

Chapters 3-5 consider what kinds of truths Nietzsche thinks philosophers can attain knowledge of (even if, per Chapter 2, Nietzsche no longer thinks philosophers can be successful at disseminating them to the masses). Chapter 3 is the most successful of these, making a reasonable case that Nietzsche, in fact, has inconsistent views about the possibility of truth and knowledge, but that he, nonetheless, remains interested in discovering "factual truth" (69 ff.).

Chapter 4 tackles directly what must surely seem to be the most important obstacle to Shaw's project of saddling Nietzsche with the Question and its suppositions: namely, that he doesn't, in fact, think there are any moral truths, or that moral knowledge is possible, or that moral judgments are objective. If Nietzsche is this kind of "moral anti-realist" (to borrow Shaw's label), then he could not intelligibly be worried about the "genuine" normative authority of the state, or think that philosophers could have rational insight into such "genuine" authority, or be worried that philosophers would be unable to secure a general consensus in the population at large around their special moral "knowledge." He would not, in fact, be Shaw's philosopher who is "committed to the quest for … normative truth" (151).[4]

Shaw's strategy of argument against the anti-realist reading is a curious one. She does not, in fact, spend a great deal of time examining the apparently overwhelming textual evidence in its support (more on that in a moment) and then try to explain that evidence away. Instead, she argues against reading Nietzsche as a moral anti-realist by appeal to other positions he allegedly holds, arguing that the anti-realist reading cannot make sense of them. That interpretive strategy would certainly create a problem for the anti-realist reading, even if (as I believe to be the case) the textual evidence for it is overwhelming, but it would hardly establish that he is not an anti-realist about moral value, absent some alternative account of the passages in question. In any case, Shaw's strategy of argument generates an interpretive dilemma for the moral anti-realist reading only if (1) the putatively incompatible positions in question are really ones Nietzsche holds, and (2) the anti-realist can't explain them. Shaw's argument runs into trouble on both points.

I take it Shaw's argument in Chapter 4 turns on two central claims. First, Shaw argues that the anti-realist will have trouble "trying to make sense of Nietzsche's objection to political self-justification" (78), precisely because that objection turns on Nietzsche's commitment to evaluative freedom (79, 126). But, as we have already noted, Shaw does not have very good evidence that Nietzsche has any real interest in the phenomenon of "political self-justification," though his colleague Burckhardt did. And her earlier evidence for Nietzsche's alleged commitment to evaluative freedom is similarly problematic. In Chapter 4, she now claims that, "The idea that rational criticism can be a means to attaining an important form of freedom originates in Nietzsche's middle period. There he comes to see that our drives, rather than being immutable determinants of our behavior, can be brought under reflective control" (104). Her "authority" for this proposition is, yet again, one snippet from Human, All too Human (sec. 2), which is ambiguous, and then citations to some other commentators, centrally Alexander Nehamas, for the proposition (as Shaw puts it) that, "We are not, pace Leiter, simply stuck with the basic determinants of our values being what they are. We can come to understand them and modify them" (104). Since in the work of mine Shaw cites (for the "pace Leiter") I explicitly critique Nehamas's take on this issue, I was surprised to see no substantive discussion of the primary texts that bear on this point, just reliance on "authority."[5]

Shaw's second key argument against the moral anti-realist reading of Nietzsche is this: "Defenders of an overall antirealist reading of Nietzsche have to offer some explanation of the fact that his objectivist-sounding value judgments and his anti-objectivist meta-ethics seem prima facie to conflict" (81-82). Shaw, in fact, cites me in the accompanying footnote (82 n. 11) articulating the problem, but, surprisingly, never mentions my detailed response to it in the very book she cites (see my Nietzsche on Morality [2002], pp. 153-155). Here is the abbreviated version: a moral anti-realist like Nietzsche committed to the polemical project of disabusing certain readers of their 'false consciousness' about morality -- their false belief that it is good for them -- has every reason to use all available rhetorical devices to achieve that end. Indeed, recognizing that ours is a world without any objective moral truths, Nietzsche has a special reason to browbeat his readers with his own (subjective) judgments of value, since there is no rational basis for converting them to his evaluative tastes. And it perhaps bears emphasizing that that is how Nietzsche describes his own posture: "What is now decisive against Christianity is our taste [Geschmack], no longer our reasons" (The Gay Science, sec. 132). The "revaluation of Christian values" he says is an "attempt, undertaken with every means" to bring "the counter-values [die Gegen-Werte] … to victory" (The Antichrist, sec. 61) -- not the "true" values or the "objectively correct" ones, but simply the opposite ones, the ones that appeal to a very different taste. Now my interpretation of Nietzsche's rhetoric may well be inadequate, but I was surprised not to see Shaw actually respond to this possible reading, especially after citing my statement of the problem and given her failure to even consider the overwhelming textual evidence of his moral anti-realism.

And the latter evidence is, I am afraid, quite substantial. For the benefit of those who are not well-versed in Nietzsche's texts, let me mention some of the evidence that Nietzsche is a moral anti-realist, who does not think that philosophers have rational insights into "normative truths." There are, first of all, the many passages where Nietzsche calls for the "creation" of values, since "men gave themselves all their good and evil … . [T]hey did not take it, they did not find it, nor did it come to them as a voice from heaven" (Thus Spoke Zarathustra, Part I, sec. 15). But these passages -- Shaw herself mentions one passage in this vein from The Gay Science (p. 90) -- just scratch the surface.

In Daybreak, Nietzsche notes that just as we now recognize that it was "an enormous error" "when man gave all things a sex" but still believed "not that he was playing, but that he had gained a profound insight," so, too, man "has ascribed to all that exists a connection with morality [Moral] and laid an ethical significance [ethische Bedeutung] on the world's back," which will "one day" be viewed as meaningful as talk about "the masculinity or femininity of the sun" (3). So, too, in Shaw's favorite work, Human-All-Too-Human, Nietzsche compares religious, moral and aesthetic judgment with astrology:

It is probable that the objects of the religious, moral [moralisch] and aesthetic experiences belong only to the surface of things, while man likes to believe that here at least he is in touch with the heart of the world; the reason he deludes himself is that these things produce in him such profound happiness and unhappiness, and thus he exhibits here the same pride as in the case of astrology. For astrology believes the heavenly stars revolve around the fate of man; the moral man [moralische Mensch], however, supposes that what he has essentially at heart must also constitute the essence [Wesen] and heart of things. (HAH 4)

Just as the astrologist thinks that there are astrological facts (about man's future) supervening on the astronomical facts about the stars -- when, in fact, there are only the stars themselves, obeying their laws of motion -- so too the "moral man" thinks his moral experiences are responsive to moral properties that are part of the essence of things, when, like the astrological facts, they are simply to be explained by our feelings. As Nietzsche puts it, moral judgments are "images" and "fantasies," the mere effects of psychological and physiological facts about the people making those judgments (Daybreak, sec. 119).

The idea that, against this backdrop, Nietzsche thinks philosophers have special insights into moral truths seems a bit incredible. Indeed, Nietzsche writes:

It is a very remarkable moment: the Sophists verge upon the first critique of morality [Moral], the first insight into morality: -- they juxtapose the multiplicity (the geographical relativity) of the moral value judgments [Moralischen Werthurtheile]; -- they let it be known that every morality [Moral] can be dialectically justified; i.e., they divine that all attempts to give reasons for morality [Moral] are necessarily sophistical -- a proposition later proved on the grand scale by the ancient philosophers, from Plato onwards (down to Kant); -- they postulate the first truth that a "morality-in-itself" [eine Moral an sich], a "good-in-itself" does not exist, that it is a swindle to talk of "truth" in this field. (The Will to Power, sec. 428; KSA 13: 14[116]).

This notebook passage is of a piece with many similarly derisive comments in the published works, as when Nietzsche mocks "[t]he … stiff and decorous Tartuffery of the old Kant, as he lures us on the dialectical bypaths that lead to his 'categorical imperative' -- really lead astray and seduce" (Beyond Good and Evil, sec. 5), or when he describes, in the same passage, Kant's "Tartuffery" and Spinoza's "hocus-pocus of mathematical form" in the Ethics as "the subtle tricks of old moralists and preachers of morals." Philosophers, Nietzsche says, "make one laugh" with their idea of "morality as science," in their pursuit of "a rational foundation for morality," which "seen clearly in the light of day" was really only a "scholarly form of good faith in the dominant morality, a new way of expressing it." Pointing at Schopenhauer's attempt to supply a rational foundation for morality, Nietzsche says "we can draw our conclusions as to how scientific a 'science' could be when its ultimate masters still talk like children" (Beyond Good and Evil, sec. 186).

Shaw's silence about these passages is, I must admit, surprising.[6] Her failure to address them directly, coupled with what seemed to me an otherwise unconvincing strategy of argument in Chapter 4, left this reader with the sense that on a crucial issue -- whether Nietzsche could really be committed to the pursuit of moral truths or think that philosophers have special insight into them -- Shaw's account was wholly unpersuasive. To be sure, Shaw claims that even if Nietzsche is an anti-realist, he would still be a political skeptic in her sense, because he would "lack a coherent conception of how his own values might ground political authority" (4). However, in Chapter 4, she mainly adduces this point about "political incoherence" as yet more evidence of the "idiosyncrasy of the antirealist reading of Nietzsche" (107), i.e., she offers it as another reductio against attributing moral anti-realism to Nietzsche. Of course, it can only serve this function if we are convinced that Nietzsche is engaged in the project of trying to show "how his own values might ground political authority." I am, for reasons already noted, not persuaded that Nietzsche had any interest in this project.

In Chapter 5, Shaw defends the alternative, "moral realist" reading of Nietzsche, according to which "the reasons that he offers us for his revaluations will have to be offered as valid reasons for anyone" (110). This reading confronts, of course, the textual obstacles just noted, though they remain unaddressed here as well. The handful of new passages she adduces on behalf of her preferred reading are interesting ones, but it seems to me they don't quite support her points. Since this review is already long enough, let me offer just one example.

Shaw cites (128-129) sec. 186 of Beyond Good and Evil, in which Nietzsche calls attention to the need to document carefully the diversity of and subtle differences among moralities. According to Shaw, Nietzsche's point is this: "Without a breadth of understanding of diverse moral phenomena, it is hard to distinguish rationalizations of parochial views from genuine rational justifications" (129). It is true that this passage does mock philosophers who offer what are really post-hoc rationalizations for the morality currently accepted in their community, but where is the evidence that Nietzsche thinks there is such a thing as a "genuine rational justification" for any moral view to be had? Nothing in sec. 186 or the rest of the chapter invites that conclusion. Rather, as Nietzsche tells us in the very next section (187), what we can really learn from studying different moral judgments is what they "tell us about the people who make them." The point, in short, of studying the diversity of moral views is to see what they reveal about different types of people and their psychological needs. That is what a "natural history of morals" -- the chapter's title -- seeks to uncover (the psychological causes of different kinds of moral judgments), not a genuine "rational justification" of morality, which Nietzsche, as we have seen, derides.

Shaw, to her credit, admits that Nietzsche's scattered "normative claims about politics" "are undefended, and they are never developed into a coherent political theory" and that Nietzsche "has … contempt for normative political theory" (33), and that "Nietzsche never addressed systematically the core questions of political thought" (137). But she thinks all these facts about his writing result from "his insight that the consensus required by political life cannot be readily achieved, except through unacceptable forms of political manipulation" (62). That might be plausible if there were good evidence Nietzsche was worried about "unacceptable" forms of political manipulation, rather than, as we noted earlier, lamenting the passing of "unconditional authority" (HAH 441). There is, moreover, another possibility, represented by one of the more familiar strands in the secondary literature noted at the start, namely, that Nietzsche has no political philosophy at all, that he views politics as a debased terrain, and that he conceives his mature project as that of a kind of esoteric moralist who aims to transform the consciousness about morality of his select readers, leaving, as he often says, "herd morality for the herd." That too would explain why his miscellaneous political remarks are "undefended" and why he "never develop[s] … a coherent political theory." I am inclined to think it is the more plausible explanation, given the difficulties that afflict Shaw's alternative.

NPS is meticulously footnoted, and Shaw displays a wide and generally deep knowledge of all the pertinent secondary literature. I believe this is the first time I have read a work that cites book reviews I have written, though in each case the citation was substantive: there was a point made in the review that really was relevant to the issues at hand. Shaw is also quite generous in her treatment of other commentators, even when they are, like Leo Strauss, fairly irresponsible. Her discussions of Burckhardt, Lange, Rankean nationalists, and other contemporaneous intellectual developments are learned, lucid, and helpful. The book is almost always quite well-informed about philosophical issues that affect her reading, and Shaw is particularly good, I thought, in her critique of Nadeem Hussain's important "fictionalist" reading of Nietzsche (see esp. 92-94). Most books by political theorists on Nietzsche are unreadable for philosophers; this book is the exception that proves the rule. I would not hesitate to say that it is the best book on Nietzsche's political theory I have ever read, even though I find it unpersuasive. Philosophers interested in Nietzsche's political thought will have to read this book, and it certainly deserves critical attention and response.



[1] For similar statements of these points see, e.g., pp. 34, 57, 58, 77, 112, 138.

[2] Early on (p. 7), Shaw sketches what she calls a 'transcendental argument' for Nietzsche's interest in the problem of the ideological hegemony of the state, but it depends on the assumption that Nietzsche is committed to "evaluative freedom" in Shaw's sense, which also seems to me doubtful for reasons to be discussed.

[3] I should note that GS 335 does not support a compatibilist answer to the question, but Shaw, in any case, does not even acknowledge that there is an interpretive puzzle here.

[4] Shaw switches back and forth between talk about "normative truth" and questions of "moral" realism and anti-realism. I take it that it is specifically moral truth that is at issue on Shaw's reading, as her Chapters 4 and 5 make clear.

[5] On my reading of Nietzsche, which Shaw is usually quite good at representing, our native endowment is modifiable within certain natural parameters, but not by the exercise of rational discursiveness. Shaw does consider some of my arguments for this view at pp. 97-100, but she is here a bit confused about the evidence and arguments I offer. Authors claiming to have been misread can, of course, be tedious critics, so I won't belabor the points here, especially since I am, in general, quite favorably impressed with her fair-minded representation of my views and those of other scholars.

[6] So, too, is her silence about the passages in which Nietzsche mocks philosophers for their general pretense to be moved only by rational considerations, rather than ulterior moral and psychological purposes -- a central and famous theme, for example, of the first chapter of Beyond Good and Evil.