2009.02.08

Michael Della Rocca

Spinoza

Michael Della Rocca, Spinoza, Routledge, 2008, 341pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415283304.

Reviewed by Michael LeBuffe, Texas A&M University


Spinoza is at once an excellent introduction to Spinoza's philosophy and a major contribution to Spinoza scholarship. The book's central theme, the prominence and systematic importance of the Principle of Sufficient Reason (PSR) in Spinoza’s thought, contributes to both of these qualities. For undergraduate philosophy students it serves as a working interpretative thesis through which some of the most difficult claims of Spinoza's philosophy -- for example, that self-destruction is impossible, or that conceptual dependence just is causal dependence -- may be evaluated and understood. For Spinoza scholars, Della Rocca's claim that Spinoza is driven to a particular kind of argument by the demand for explanation and a concomitant rejection of brute facts offers an appealing, unifying interpretation of the Ethics and elements of Spinoza's political philosophy. Rigorous treatments of Spinoza's philosophy, either because they tend to tackle the difficult claims of the Ethics in isolation from one another or because they devote themselves to one subject while bracketing others, tend to de-emphasize an important test for the plausibility of an interpretation of one of Spinoza's positions: its consistency with other positions in the book and its usefulness as a tool in helping us to understand those positions. Della Rocca's emphasis on the PSR reverses this trend. On Della Rocca's account, Spinoza's insistence that absolutely everything is intelligible explains important elements of his metaphysics, epistemology, psychology, ethics, political theory and eschatology. Spinoza will challenge scholars who disagree with Della Rocca to develop equally clear and well-grounded alternative accounts of what is characteristic of Spinozism, a formidable task.

The book is well-organized and offers several features that make it accessible to those who are new to Spinoza. Each chapter has a clear structure and includes, at the end, a summary and well-chosen suggestions for further reading. Chapter One introduces the PSR, focusing on its "twofold use" in the Ethics (which Della Rocca takes to characterize Spinoza's rationalism) and arguing that Spinoza's naturalism follows straightforwardly from the PSR. Della Rocca holds that 1p11d2 (that is, Ethics, Part 1, Proposition 11, Demonstration 2) contains the clearest instance of the PSR in Spinoza's writings: "For each thing there must be assigned a cause or reason, both for its existence and for its nonexistence." The twofold use of the PSR, to which I will return below, is first, a demand for an explanation of a given fact, and second, an explanation of the fact at issue in terms of explanation itself. Naturalism -- which here means the view that all things, including all human beings, are governed by the same principles -- follows from the PSR, according to Della Rocca, because any local principles, such as any principles which applied to human beings alone, would be inexplicable. Chapter One also includes a brief biography.

Chapter Two covers Spinoza's most basic metaphysics: his theory of substance, the argument for substance monism, the theory of modes, and necessitarianism. Della Rocca includes a negative claim in this list as well: Spinoza's claim that God does not act with a purpose. In my opinion, this is very appropriate for an introduction to Spinoza. Spinoza's rejection of divine teleology is indeed among his most important and interesting metaphysical views. Whether or not other scholars agree with me, they should find the Spinozistic argument to the claim, which Della Rocca constructs from Spinoza's naturalism, worthy of attention.

Chapters Three through Seven focus more narrowly on human beings. Chapter Three, on the human mind, covers many of the important claims of Part 2 of the Ethics. As in the rest of the book, Della Rocca does more than describe Spinoza's views and attempt to make them sound plausible. He builds a controversial, detailed, well-structured interpretation of Spinoza's parallelism, his theory of ideas, and his responses to Cartesian theories about mind and body and about human mental faculties. An especially important feature of Della Rocca's view is his claim that all features of mind are representational and that they are only representational.

Chapter Four defends an interpretation, grounded in Spinoza's commitment to the PSR, of 3p4-3p9, Spinoza's characterization of the human conatus in terms of a striving basic to any singular thing. From that interpretation, Della Rocca builds an account of Spinoza's theory of human affects. A highlight of this chapter is Della Rocca's use of the notion of anticipation as a means of resolving an interpretative problem that arises from the conatus doctrine. Spinoza holds that all things strive to persevere in being but also that human beings strive to increase their power of striving. These ends might seem to require different actions in many cases, as, for example, when a farmer risks injury in working long hours to clear more land. On the face of it, this is a case of neglecting perseverance in favor increasing the power to persevere. Della Rocca notes Spinoza's emphasis on the human ability to anticipate future threats. He argues (in line with Spinoza's defenses of the rationality of maximizing goods at 4p65 and 66) that striving to protect oneself against future threats to perseverance by increasing one's power to persevere is, in effect, simply a striving to persevere: it is preferring a greater future good to a lesser present one.

Chapter Five covers, principally, Part 4 of the Ethics. It defends accounts of central notions of Spinoza's theories of freedom and bondage -- including his descriptions of good and evil, his intellectualism, and his theory of freedom -- in light of the interpretations offered earlier in the book. Della Rocca also includes discussions of several particularly troublesome aspects of Part 4: the lack of explicitly prescriptive language on it, the de-emphasis of other-regarding morality, and Spinoza's apparently Kantian assertion at 4p72 that a free man never deceives.

In Chapter Six Della Rocca covers Spinoza's political philosophy showing that Spinoza offers, in an important way, a single body of philosophical argument. He emphasizes the importance of rationalism and naturalism in the Tractatus Politicus and the Tractatus Theologico-Politicus, and, in an engaging argument, uses Spinoza's commitment to naturalism to criticize aspects of his political theory that seem to violate it. Della Rocca argues that Spinoza's justification of important freedoms (thought and speech) applies equally well to the freedom of action, which Spinoza argues is legitimately restricted. Holding the freedom of action to a different standard than these other freedoms seems arbitrary and at odds with Spinoza's commitment to the view that all things are governed by the same principles.

Chapter Seven introduces some of the most pressing problems related to Spinoza's theory of eternity and offers a basic framework -- an account on which to exist fully is to be fully intelligible -- for mitigating them. To exist eternally for Spinoza, Della Rocca argues, is to exist fully, and to increase that part of the mind that exists eternally, therefore, is to increase the robustness of one's existence.

Finally, Chapter Eight describes the influence of Spinoza's ideas on later thinkers, including Leibniz, Bayle, Hume, Jacobi, Lessing, Mendelssohn, Hegel, and Nietzsche. Della Rocca appropriately limits his survey to figures who grasped philosophically important (and not merely scandalous) elements of Spinoza's thought and to figures who reasonably may be said to have reacted to those themes that are the focus of Della Rocca's interpretation. I found the discussion of Hume to be especially interesting and, at the least, a useful starting point for a comparison. As Della Rocca reads Spinoza and Hume, the philosophers largely agree about what the PSR and its sometimes counterintuitive implications are. Spinoza was deeply committed to the PSR, so he accepted the implications. Hume found the implications to be hopeless, so he rejected the PSR.

To return now to the central theme of Spinoza, the characteristically Spinozistic use of the PSR on Della Rocca's account is twofold in that it is first a demand for an explanation of any fact and second an explanation of that fact in terms of explanation itself. Della Rocca finds this twofold use throughout Spinoza's philosophy. For example, in his interpretation of Spinoza's views on causation (pp. 44-45), Della Rocca writes that, first, Spinoza rejects any notion according to which causation is a brute fact. If causation is a fact, it must have an explanation. Causal connection as Spinoza understands it, however, is a conceptual truth: if B really must follow A, then to say that A can fail to lead to B is to misunderstand A. So the explanation that Spinoza provides of causation reduces causation itself to intelligibility. Consider another example (there are very many in the book). Della Rocca (p. 183) takes Spinoza's theory of the good to involve a twofold use of the PSR. Spinoza thinks, as many have, that the goodness of a good thing requires explanation. Any true explanation of the goodness of a thing will have to make goodness "a function" of the thing's nature. A thing's nature, however, is its causal power, and its causal power -- as we have already seen -- is its capacity to explain changes in things. Goodness, then, must be part of intelligibility itself.

Traditionally, I think, a discussion of the strategy of finding the heart of Spinoza's philosophy in the twofold use of the PSR would begin with an objection from the principle of charity. Such an objection might go like this:

Spinoza does indeed identify explanation and causation. Perhaps he does so from a twofold use of the PSR. That identification does affect a number of his positions. However, identifying explanation and causation is an embarrassing blunder, so let's look elsewhere for what is interesting in his philosophy.

Spinoza decisively overcomes this objection. In the first place, the twofold use occurs too often and with too much importance to be set aside in the interpretation of Spinoza. What is left after it is set aside is not a unified body of thought. In the second place, as Della Rocca admirably shows, Spinoza's rationalism yields too many interesting and valuable arguments to be dismissed, out of hand, as a blunder.

I will raise instead two much more limited concerns about Della Rocca's strategy. These are not objections. The first is a question to which I do not myself have an answer. The second is a concern about a way in which an emphasis on the PSR leaves important features of Spinoza's philosophy unexplored. First, the question. Granting the importance of the PSR and its twofold use, why does Spinoza not introduce it, or even name it, in the formal apparatus of the Ethics? On Della Rocca's own account of the principle, its clearest appearance is as a self-evident premise in an alternative demonstration. That point leads me to wonder, not whether Spinoza uses the principle as extensively as Della Rocca says he does, but whether the PSR holds the same sort of fundamental place in Spinoza's metaphysics that it does, for example, in that of Leibniz, whose commitment to it as a basic principle is explicit and emphatic. Perhaps the question may be answered by pointing to several claims that are in the formal apparatus of the Ethics and that might seem to be related to the PSR. These include the definition of substance as what is conceived through itself (1d3), the axiom that whatever cannot be conceived through another thing must be conceived through itself (1a3), and the notorious axiom that the knowledge of an effect depends upon and "involves" (perhaps, as Alan Gabbey has argued, 'involvere' means "implies") it (1a4). Given these claims, the relatively understated commitment to the PSR in the Ethics, and the central application, in Spinoza, of the twofold use to the case of causation, I wonder whether the PSR is really Spinoza's most fundamental commitment or whether it would be better to argue that it derives from these or other more basic convictions. I do not, however, have a proposal about what that derivation might look like.

The second concern is one that I think might be raised about any rigorous introduction to Spinoza's thought, that is, any introduction that seeks to explore Spinoza's arguments rather than simply describe his positions. Tracing a single line of argument, however important, inevitably will de-emphasize some important features of Spinoza's philosophy. It is certainly justified to do this in an introduction to Spinoza's philosophy. It would be far worse to follow no threads through the Ethics, and confusing to follow many at once. And Della Rocca's emphasis on Spinoza's rationalism, because of its usefulness in explaining a number of difficult positions, is a very good choice. Nevertheless it is worth mentioning some of what is sacrificed by an emphasis on the PSR.

One thing that is lost is attention to those of Spinoza's claims that are not explained. Leibniz positively relies upon the fact that the PSR, despite its universality, is not, in a way, actually a very demanding restriction on philosophy: a commitment to the claim that all facts have an explanation is not a commitment to provide that explanation, and Leibniz is happy to point this out when faced with complexity or particular evils. Similarly, for Spinoza, facts about the world, although they must be explicable, need not be explained, and many interesting claims that Spinoza makes, although they are neither well-explained nor self-evident, are important features of his philosophy. Here are some prominent examples. People find things in the world that help them to persevere to be good (1 Appendix). If I have roughly equal tendencies to think two incompatible thoughts, A and B, I will waver between the thought of A and the thought of B (2p44s). Humility, reverence and repentance, although they are not virtues, are advantageous to an ordinary person (4p54s). I do not think that Spinoza offers an explanation for any of these claims, nor is an explanation for them readily built from Spinozistic principles. Nevertheless each is important to the argument of the Ethics. An emphasis on Spinoza's demand for explanation de-emphasizes these and other such claims.

Another thing that is lost, and this may be a greater loss for an introduction to Spinoza, is attention to Spinoza's choice of subject. In my opinion, two of the most important passages for understanding the most general features of Spinoza's philosophy are the first paragraph of the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, where Spinoza describes his commitment to discovering the true good, and a similar passage in the Ethics, the Preface to Part 2, where Spinoza writes that he will not describe all of what his metaphysics explains, but only what will lead us to human blessedness. Just as the PSR does not promise that everything will actually be explained, it also does not, of itself, explain why what is actually explained is covered in Spinoza's philosophy or why what is not explained is left out. Spinoza, though, explicitly chooses to build an account of the means to human blessedness, and this commitment underlies the structure and much of the argument of the Ethics.

Spinoza emphasizes some aspects of Spinoza's thought and de-emphasizes others, as any introduction must. However, Della Rocca captures perhaps the central theme of Spinoza's philosophy, his rationalism, in a clear and powerful way. Spinoza offers highly original, often brilliant scholarship and will be an indispensable resource for undergraduates.