2005.01.01

Jerrold Katz

Sense, Reference, and Philosophy

Katz, Jerrold, Sense, Reference, and Philosophy. Oxford, 2004. 224pp, $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 019515813X.

Reviewed by Ben Caplan, University of Manitoba


Sense, Reference, and Philosophy, Jerrold J. Katz's last book, was completed shortly before the death in 2002 of the celebrated philosopher. The book is divided into three parts along the lines that its title suggests. The first part of the book is on sense. There Katz argues for his new intensionalism, which is a non-Fregean view of sense. (Katz's view is intensionalist insofar as it is a view on which senses play a semantically significant role, and his view is new insofar as it is non-Fregean.) There are two key features of Katz's new intensionalism. First, sense is what determines sense properties and relations: for example, "meaningfulness, meaninglessness, ambiguity, synonymy, redundancy, and antonymy" (p. 17). And, second, senses are mereologically complex so that, for example, the sense of 'unmarried' is a part of the sense of 'bachelor'.1 Each of these features corresponds to a respect in which Katz's view is non-Fregean. First, on Katz's new intensionalism, sense does not determine reference. A theory of sense is one thing; a theory of reference, another. And, second, the mereological complexity of sense allows Katz to develop a view of analyticity on which it is grounded in mereological rather than logical relations among senses. Here Katz opts for Kant's "beams in a house" view of analyticity (on which the analytic consequences of a thought are contained in it "as beams are contained in a house," as Frege put it) over Frege's own "plants in a seed" view of analyticity (on which the analytic consequences of a thought are contained in it "as plants are contained in their seeds," as Frege put it). The second part of the book is on reference. Having rejected the view that sense determines reference, Katz replaces it with the view that sense mediates reference. On this view, sense is necessary but not sufficient for reference. (The second part of the book also contains further material on analyticity.) The third (and longest) part of the book is on philosophy. There Katz applies his new intensionalism to a host of philosophical topics—including the Liar paradox, presupposition, vagueness, indeterminacy, and existence—and argues that, where Fregean intensionalism fails to illuminate them, his new intensionalism provides insights or solutions. The point of this part of the book is to illustrate the usefulness of the theories that Katz develops in the first two parts of the book.

Sense

In the first part of the book, Katz offers three arguments against Fregean intensionalism and in favor of his new intensionalism. The first is that Fregean intensionalism constrains sense too strongly: it requires that sense determine reference and hence leaves intensionalism vulnerable to familiar anti-intensionalist arguments. For example, if sense determines reference, and if the sense of 'gold' is given by 'the metal that has such-and-such surface properties', then, had some metal g other than gold had those surface properties, 'gold' would have referred to g rather than to gold; but 'gold' would have referred to gold rather than to g, even if g had those surface properties and gold did not. Katz writes,

Since Mill's, Wittgenstein's, Putnam's, Kripke's, and Fodor's arguments share the Fregean assumption that senses are reference-determiners, Fregean intensionalists have no reply to them. They are hoist with their own petard. But, having no commitment to this assumption, an intentionalism based on (D) [i.e. the claim that sense determines sense properties and relations] can reply that all such anti-intensionalist arguments are unsound. (p. 23)

There are two problems with this argument. The first problem is that Fregean intensionalists have several replies to the familiar anti-intensionalist arguments. For example, over the last thirty years or so, a sizeable literature has arisen over whether names are synonymous with definite descriptions that must take wide scope with respect to modal operators or with definite descriptions that are rigidified by 'actually' or some such operator.2 To pass over this literature in silence and proclaim Fregean intensionalism dead, by auto-explosion or otherwise, is too quick. The second problem is that, on Katz's view, sense is necessary for reference. So, if the sense of 'gold' is given by 'the metal that has such-and-such surface properties', then 'gold' could not refer to gold if gold did not have those surface properties. Avoiding the conclusion that 'gold' would refer to g if g had those surface properties only at the cost of being saddled with the conclusion that 'gold' would not refer to gold if gold did not have those surface properties does not seem like much of an advantage for Katz's new intensionalism over Frege's old intensionalism.

The second argument against Fregean intensionalism is that it constrains sense too weakly: in saying only that sense determines reference, Fregean intensionalism leaves open the possibility that 'gavagai', for example, is synonymous with any number of expressions, including 'rabbit', 'rabbit stage', 'undetached rabbit part', and so on. But, it seems, a Fregean intensionalist could reply that, in saying that sense determines reference, she is offering an account of what senses are rather than an account of which expressions have which senses. She might add that she is free to supplement her account of what senses are with any number of principles to constrain the relation between expressions and their senses.

The third argument against Fregean intensionalism is that it imposes the wrong constraint on senses: by grounding analyticity in logical rather than mereological relations between senses, it has the consequence that all sentences are synonymous. Katz writes,

If the content of concepts is determined on the basis of the laws of logic, then there can be no concepts. The point goes back to Wittgenstein, who [in Philosophical Grammar] observed that, as a determiner of the content of concepts, P(PQ) commits us to saying that the sense of a sentence S includes the sense of the sentence S or S' where S' is any sentence whatever (1974: 248-249). Thus, Frege's account of the content of concepts produces a semantic collapse in which the sense of each sentence of the language is the disjunction of the senses of every sentence of the language. The sense of each sentence of the language includes and is included in the sense of every sentence (in the sense in which the meaning of 'spouse' includes both the meaning of 'husband' and the meaning of 'wife'). Hence, the content of every sentence is the same as that of every other sentence: all sentences are synonymous. (p. 30)

But, it seems, a Fregean intensionalist could reply that, if S logically entails S or S', that has something to do with the sense of 'or' and nothing to do with the sense of S or the sense of S'. (And, puzzlingly, it seems that, in attributing to Fregean intensionalists the view that the sense of one sentence contains the sense of another "in the sense in which the meaning of 'spouse' includes both the meaning of 'husband' and the meaning of 'wife'," Katz is attributing his own view, on which senses have mereological or other structure, to Fregean intensionalists.)

Reference

The idea that sense does not determine reference is bold and promising. But the view that Katz develops in the second part of the book is not as bold as one might have expected. Katz ends up preserving much of the original claim that sense determines reference. First, he thinks that, for all expressions, sense is necessary for reference: he says that his view "takes sense to be necessary but not sufficient for reference" (p. 47). And, second, he thinks that, for a wide variety of expressions ("expressions for artifactual kinds, like 'dwelling', geometrical kinds, like 'square', occupational kinds, like 'doctor', linguistic kinds, like 'anagram', and mathematical kinds, like 'prime'," p. 54), sense is sufficient for reference: "Their senses are sufficient to determine their type-extensions" (p. 54). As a result, the view that Katz develops in the second part of the book is not as promising as one might have expected. For example, it is because he concedes that sense is necessary for reference that, as already mentioned, Katz's view doesn't seem to fare much better than Fregean intensionalism in dealing with merely possible situations in which g, rather than gold, has the surface properties that gold actually has.

Philosophy

Katz covers twenty or so topics in the third part of the book. Most of these topics cannot be discussed here. The third part of the book is designed to illustrate the usefulness of abandoning Fregean intensionalism in favor of Katz's new intensionalism. But, in some cases, it is not clear why Fregean intensionalism should get the blame for some problem. For example, after criticizing Frege's deflationary claim that S is true and S express the same thought, Katz says, "Perhaps it is Frege's conception of sense that led him to think that the sentences say the same thing" (p. 73). After all, "both sentences express [or determine] the same function from domain to truth value" (p. 73). But it seems that Fregean intensionalists could reply that, although sense determines reference, it is possible for more than one sense to determine the same referent (otherwise there would be no solution to Frege's Puzzle!) and hence that it is possible for two thoughts to be equivalent: that is, to determine "the same function from domain to truth value."

In other cases, it is not clear why Katz's new intensionalism should get the credit for some solution. For example, Katz denies that 'Santa Claus does not exist' is about anything and hence denies that it is about something that exists; and he says that 'Santa Claus does not exist' is true if and only if 'Santa Claus' doesn't refer to anything. These are sensible things to say about 'Santa Claus does not exist'; but they are also things that Fregean intensionalists can say.

And, in yet other cases, it is not clear whether some solution that Katz's new intensionalism gets the credit for works. For example, Katz's solution to the Liar paradox is to deny that 'This sentence is not true' expresses a truth-evaluable proposition. He says that it expresses an intensional proposition (one that has to do with sense properties) but not an extensional proposition (one that has to do with reference properties, including truth); and it is precisely because he denies that sense determines reference that he takes it that he can allow sentences to express intensional propositions without expressing extensional ones. One might worry that his views in the second part of the book become an issue here. Since he ends up retaining so much of the claim that sense determines reference (and, in particular, since he says that the sense of an expression for a linguistic kind—'sentence', say—determines it reference), one might worry that, once he allows that the Liar sentence expresses an intensional proposition, he cannot so easily avoid the conclusion that it expresses an extensional proposition as well.

[1] Katz says that 'bachelor' and 'unmarried bachelor' are not synonymous, because "the sense unmarried occurs once in the sense of 'bachelor' but twice in the sense of 'unmarried bachelor'" (p. 67). But, if the sense unmarried is a part of the sense of 'bachelor', then adding the sense unmarried to the sense of 'bachelor' should yield the sense of 'bachelor'. This suggests that, contrary to what Katz says, his view is not one on which the sense unmarried is a part (in the mereological sense) of the sense of 'bachelor'. Still, his view is one on which senses have some kind of decompositional structure; and this is part of what is supposed to distinguish his view from Fregean intensionalism.

[2] On the view that names are synonymous with definite descriptions that must take wide scope with respect to modal operators, see, for example, Michael A.E. Dummett, Frege: Philosophy of Language, 1973, 2nd ed. (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1981) and The Interpretation of Frege's Philosophy (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1981); Jason Stanley, "Names and Rigid Designation," A Companion to the Philosophy of Language, ed. Bob Hale and Crispin Wright (Oxford: Blackwell, 1997), 555-585; and David Sosa, "Rigidity in the Scope of Russell's Theory," Nous 35.1 (March 2001): 1-38. On the view that names are synonymous with definite descriptions that are rigidified by 'actually' or some such operator, see, for example, Alvin Plantinga, "The Boethian Compromise," American Philosophical Quarterly 15.2 (April 1978): 129-138; Tyler Burge, "Sinning against Frege," Philosophical Review 88.3 (July 1979): 398-432; Gareth Evans, "Reference and Contingency," Monist 62.2 (April 1979): 161-189; Stanley, "Names and Rigid Designation"; Frank Jackson, "Reference and Description Revisited," Philosophical Perspectives, vol. 12 (Language, Mind, and Ontology), ed. James E. Tomberlin (Boston, MA: Blackwell, 1998), 201-218; and Michael Nelson, "Descriptivism Defended," Nous 36.3 (Sept. 2002): 408-436.