2009.03.11

Shaun Gallagher

Brainstorming: Views and Interviews on the Mind

Shaun Gallagher, Brainstorming: Views and Interviews on the Mind, Imprint Academic, 2008, 276pp., $34.90 (pbk), ISBN 9781845400231.

Reviewed by Mark Okrent, Bates College


Shaun Gallagher's Brainstorming is an innovative and ambitious book. Gallagher has set himself the task of writing an introduction to the study of the mind that is accessible to "beginning students, or even experts who are approaching these topics from different fields". This goal is unusual in that introductions to a field do not typically target both beginners and experts, even if the experts are not expert in the field to which they are being introduced. This unusual goal is complemented by the fact that Gallagher has decided to introduce the study of the mind by focusing on "a set of ongoing questions and discussions that define the field", rather than on "received and established views". By itself such a strategy is not entirely uncommon, of course. There are many good reasons that an author might have for determining that the best way to approach his subject is to throw the reader directly into current debates in the field, instead of first going over well-worn territory. When he does so, however, the author needs to be sensitive to the issue of how much background must be introduced in order for the reader to understand the meaning, structure, and importance of those debates. In the case of Brainstorming, this need for sensitivity is complicated both by the complexity of Gallagher's target audience and by the way in which he understands the contemporary study of the mind. The amount and nature of the background information necessary or sufficient for outside experts might not be necessary or sufficient for a beginning student. But in addition, the way in which Gallagher selects the 'ongoing questions and discussions' that for him define the field of the study of the mind imposes a further constraint. As Gallagher understands it, contemporary study of the mind involves the 'triangulation' of three strands, 'phenomenological description and clarification' of essentially first person evidence, 'philosophical conceptual analysis', and the results of 'experimental science', both from cognitive science and neuroscience. So, to be successful on its own terms, Brainstorming not only needs to supply for beginning students an intelligible introduction to contemporary investigation of the mind in several research traditions, but also needs to help readers who are familiar with work in some of those traditions come up to speed on what has been going on recently in the others. This is a tall order for any introductory volume.

These various aims account for much of the ambition of Brainstorming. The innovation arises out of the means that Gallagher uses in his attempt to achieve those goals. There are two such innovations. First, the book is organized topically, and the topics are ordered by Gallagher's own views on the epistemic and ontological priorities among various cognitive phenomena. Roughly, Gallagher holds that the mind is a 'system of embodiment' and because of that the mind is best understood if it is approached by way of an understanding of the way in which biological organisms use mental capacities in the course of achieving biologically salient ends. Which questions are considered in the book, how they are considered, and the order of their consideration, are functions of this overall orientation towards the study of the mind. So, instead of beginning as many introductions to 'The Philosophy of Mind' do, with a discussion of the nature of mental states, Gallagher (after brief sections on methodology and historical background) begins with a discussion of movement, from which he goes on to intentional action, consciousness, intersubjectivity, and emotion and empathy. It is only towards the end of the book that he comes to discuss 'language, cognition, and other extras'. Other topics, such as the proper way to understand intentionality and the nature of perception, are treated tangentially insofar as they come up in the course of the discussion of these core issues.

The second way in which Brainstorming is innovative has to do with its rhetorical character. Rather than using the usual method of essentially writing an essay, Gallagher instead structures the book around a series of edited excerpts of conversations that he has had with nine philosophically informed cognitive and neuroscientists. (To provide some historical background, Gallagher also constructs a dialogue among Socrates, Simmias, Cebes, and himself, which reproduces some of the argument of the Phaedo, and a dialogue among Descartes, Elisabeth of Bohemia, and himself.) The decision to restrict the range of the conversational partners to scientists tends to limit the content of the conversations to the third aspect of Gallagher's triangulation method, empirical science, even though the choice of the interlocutors guarantees that they have a certain amount of philosophical sensitivity and sophistication. In effect, Gallagher himself organizes and determines the conceptually analytic and phenomenological framework of the book, and turns to the scientists for experimentally derived information relevant to the issues he has structured as well as for support for his way of organizing those issues. Taken together with the emphasis on movement and action, and the extensive attempt to integrate empirical work into philosophical discussions, this rhetorical reliance on dialogue makes Brainstorming strikingly different in character from any other introduction to philosophy of mind with which I am familiar.

As is perhaps to be expected with such an ambitious and innovative venture, Brainstorming is only a partial success, and it is more successful in achieving some of its aims than it is in achieving others. It is most successful as an introduction to recent work in phenomenologically informed cognitive science for researchers who already have some familiarity with and expertise in either classical phenomenology or traditional analytic philosophy of mind. Gallagher (along with a very few others such as Sean Kelly and Dan Zahavi) is obviously one of those philosophers who are as comfortable with the texts of Merleau-Ponty or Daniel Dennett as they are with contemporary work in the cognitive science laboratory. And he moves easily back and forth among the three legs of his methodological triangle. This multiple facility allows him both to connect the cognitive science results with traditional philosophical issues, and to philosophically frame his presentation of those results. For those already familiar with the philosophical background, this provides a very helpful context in which to place the experimental science. To take just one prominent example, Gallagher's framing for his conversations with Marc Jeannerod concerning the role of representations in movement and intentional action is peppered with references to such contemporary philosophers as Hubert Dreyfus, John Searle, Andy Clark, and Mark Rowlands, as well as with discussions of Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty, together with very brief summaries of their views. So if one already has some philosophical expertise and knows those views, then Brainstorming can provide a very useful introduction to the cognitive science. And this introduction for experts is clearly one of Gallagher's aims for the book.

Even in this respect, however, the device of using excerpted conversations with leading researchers as the vehicle for conveying information regarding their research limits the extent of Brainstrorming's success as an introduction to cognitive science for philosophers. Perhaps inevitably, these conversations are full of unexplained technical terminology and implicit and explicit references to the results of experiments that are not directly discussed. Gallagher's dialogues simply presuppose too much background information to be entirely informative for those with little previous knowledge of the research tradition in which his interlocutors are embedded. So, while Brainstorming provides a useful tool for scientifically relatively naïve philosophers who have an interest in developing their knowledge of relevant aspects of work in cognitive science, by itself it is not for them a completely adequate introduction to the area.

These problems are compounded when Brainstorming is evaluated as a text for possible use as an introduction to the contemporary study of the mind for genuine beginners. While the book clearly has many virtues, and is full of valuable information and insights, it is hard to imagine how it could be successfully used in, say, an introductory course in philosophy of mind or cognitive science. Because the bulk of the discussion is presented through excerpts of actual dialogues between a well-informed philosopher and cutting edge researchers, much of the presentation presupposes knowledge of terms and a map of the terrain that simply cannot be presupposed to be present in beginning undergraduates. Consider, for example, this passage chosen almost at random from very early in the book, a passage in which Gallagher is asking Jan Panksepp whether or not his offered summary of Panksepp's views is accurate.

You suggest it's not computations or representations all the way down but at some point we need to talk about embodied, nonlinear dynamics, and still you do want to leave some place for the computational model. Is it the difference between the cortical (as computational) and the subcortical (as more nonlinear) or is it more complicated than that? (p. 18)

The problem here is not that the passage is especially dense or jargon laden, or that the ideas presented are particularly abstruse or obscure. They are not. Rather, the difficulty arises for the beginning reader from the fact that at this point in the book there has been no explicit articulation of what is meant when one speaks of computations or the computational model, or of how the word 'nonlinear' is being used in the phrase 'nonlinear dynamics', or of the difference in the functions of the cortex and the subcortex. Mostly, the beginning student is left to pick up the proper use of these terms from the context.

Brainstorming is an innovative and valuable contribution to the literature on the relation between cognitive science and philosophy. In particular, it lends important support to the recent movement that attempts to integrate the insights of the classical phenomenologists (and especially Merleau-Ponty) with recent experimental results concerning movement, action, consciousness and intersubjectivity. It will prove helpful to philosophers who are interested in that movement, or who are interested in gaining a firmer grip on some of the exciting contemporary work in cognitive and neuroscience. On the other hand, to some extent Brainstorming suffers both from a kind of false advertising and, a bit ironically, from a related lack of goal-directed focus. Brainstorming is not really a very successful introduction to the study of the mind, even if it is advertised as such. It is much more successful as an aid for philosophers who are relatively unsophisticated regarding the science of the mind. But because Gallagher has set himself the dual task of serving both audiences, it is not as successful in this second respect as it might have been.